The Four-Category Ontology: A Metaphysical Foundation for Natural Science

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E.J. Lowe, The Four-Category Ontology: A Metaphysical Foundation for Natural Science, Oxford University Press, 2006, 240pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199254397.

Reviewed by Ryan Wasserman, Western Washington University


In his latest book, E.J. Lowe develops and defends a "four-category" ontology consisting of objects, kinds, attributes, and modes. The book is, appropriately enough, divided into four sections. Part I introduces the key features of the four-category ontology, contrasting it with rival systems. Part II explains the view in more detail, focusing on the distinction between object and property. Part III then uses the resources of the four-category ontology to provide a unified theory of dispositions, laws, and causal powers. Part IV concludes with some reflections on truth, realism, and truthmaking. The book is ambitious in its goals and clear in its presentation. There is significant overlap with previously published material, but those who follow Lowe's work will appreciate having a systematic statement of his current philosophical position. New readers will also find many topics of interest.

Lowe traces his ontological ancestry back to the Categories and, like Aristotle, he begins with a pair of fundamental distinctions. First, Lowe distinguishes between substantial and non-substantial entities. Second, he distinguishes between particulars and universals. These two distinctions cut across each other, generating four fundamental categories: substantial particulars (objects, like this apple), non-substantial particulars (modes or "tropes", like the redness of this apple), non-substantial universals (attributes, like redness) and substantial universals (kinds, like apple). Objects are directly characterized by modes, which are instances of attributes. Attributes directly characterize kinds which have objects as their instances. All four categories are thus bound together in what Lowe calls "the Ontological Square".

The four-category ontology may boast an impressive pedigree, but it lacks contemporary support. Lowe conjectures that the view is typically rejected on grounds of parsimony. He counters that the four-category ontology offers superior explanatory power, so that entities are not posited beyond necessity. In particular, Lowe argues that his view provides the best account of (a) laws of nature and (b) the dispositional-categorical distinction. I will discuss these issues in turn.

Lowe's account of laws -- previously developed in Kinds of Being (Oxford: Blackwell, 1989) -- is similar to that of David Armstrong, insofar as both take laws to involve universals. For Armstrong, law statements take the form All Fs are Gs. It is a law that all Fs are Gs (as opposed to an accidentally true generalization) when the universals Fness and Gness are linked by a "necessitation" relation. Lowe, in contrast, maintains that laws are more accurately represented as having the form K is F or Ks are F, where K is a kind and F is an attribute (e.g., Benzene is flammable, electrons are negatively charged). Law statements are thus generics, rather than universal generalizations. And laws themselves are grounded in the nature of kinds, rather than the distribution of the necessitation relation.

Lowe claims three advantages over Armstrong. First, his account more accurately reflects the syntax of ordinary law statements. This may be correct, but Lowe himself admits that syntax is no sure guide to ontology. (p.25)

Second, in contrast to Armstrong, Lowe's laws allow for exceptions, this being one of the distinguishing features of generic statements. (p.145) The claim that rubber stretches, for example, is consistent with there being some non-stretchy thing made of rubber. (Contrast this with the universal generalization All rubber things are stretchy). This may be an advantage, but it also raises a difficult question: what makes some laws strict and others not? Armstrong could perhaps augment his account by allowing for a variety of more-or-less stringent necessitation relations (e.g., necessitates to degree .8, necessitates to degree .9). He could then say: when the original necessitation relation links two universals we have a strict law, whereas weaker necessitation relations give us probabilistic laws. The p give us probabilisti the weaker necessitation relations give us probabiiversals, we ahve roblem for Lowe is that, on his account, all laws have the same sort of "ontological ground": there are only attributes characterizing kinds. There are no necessitation relations to account for the difference between strict and probabilistic laws, so from whence does it come?,both are both generic statemetns, loose laws, so what is the explanation

Finally, Lowe claims an advantage over Armstrong in that he avoids a "mysterious" second-order relation of necessitation. Of course, Lowe does say that laws involve the "characterization" of kinds by attributes. What exactly is the characterization relation? Well, Lowe tells us that it is not a "genuine" relation at all, but an "internal" relation which is not an "element of being" but which nonetheless gives us a "real connection". (pp.45-7) This will strike some as obscure, but Lowe is quick to point out that Armstrong is already committed to an analogous "non-relational" tie between universals and objects. What he is not so forthcoming about is that, whereas Armstrong speaks of objects "instantiating" universals, Lowe speaks both of objects "instantiating" kinds and of attributes "characterizing" kinds. In other words, Lowe doubles the number of non-relational relations. Add to this the fact that Lowe requires a primitive distinction between substantial and non-substantial universals (i.e., kinds and attributes) and the apparent advantages over Armstrong begin to look doubtful.

Whether or not the proposed theory has any advantages over Armstrong's view, it certainly has some of the disadvantages. In addition to an expansive ontology, Lowe's theory seems vulnerable to a version of the inference problem, which has long plagued Armstrong's own account. The problem for Armstrong is to explain how facts about universals support inferences concerning particulars. Suppose, for example, that Fness necessitates Gness. How does this validate the inference from a is F to a is G? The very same challenge can be posed to Lowe. Suppose that kind K is characterized by Fness. How does this validate the inference from a is K to a is F? To take a specific example: how do we deduce that this material is water-soluble from the premises that this material is sodium-chloride and sodium-chloride is water-soluble? Lowe replies: we don't. (p.29) The inference is not deductively valid, since the law admits of exceptions. Such a reply will not help in the case of strict laws, but let that pass. Even if the inference in question is not deductively valid, it is inductively strong. Why? How do facts about universals tell us anything about particulars? This mysterious link between universals and particulars lies at the heart of the inference problem and on this crucial point Lowe has little more to say than Armstrong.

Let us turn now to the dispositional-categorical distinction. Philosophers typically distinguish between categorical and dispositional properties, where the former concern actual status and the latter concern hypothetical behavior. To ascribe squareness or roundness to an object is to say what it is like in the here and now. To ascribe elasticity or fragility, in contrast, is to point beyond the present to the realm of possibility. Lowe accepts the dispositional-categorical distinction, but locates it at the level of predicates, rather than properties. In fact, Lowe claims that dispositional and categorical ascriptions are just two different ways of attributing the same property. The key to understanding this claim is that, in Lowe's system, there are two "routes" from objects to attributes (understood as universal properties). An object can fall under a kind which is characterized by the attribute. An object can also be characterized by a mode which is an instance of the attribute. Lowe claims that this distinction corresponds to the distinction between dispositional and categorical predication, but I find the details of his account somewhat elusive. Let us focus on his example of the rubber eraser. We can truthfully assert that this piece of rubber stretches or is disposed to stretch. According to Lowe, these dispositional ascriptions are true in virtue of the fact that the eraser falls under the kind rubber, which is characterized by the attribute of stretchiness. And this might be the case, of course, even if the eraser is not currently being stretched. For the eraser to be stretching (as opposed to stretchy), is for it to be characterized by an instance of stretchiness. In other words, the categorical statement requires the existence of a corresponding mode, while the dispositional statement does not. But in both cases we are ultimately attributing the very same property.

It is this last claim I find particularly puzzling. There is stretchiness -- the property of being stretchable -- and the property of being stretched. I can understand the claim that something has the first property just in case its kind is characterized by that property. I can understand the claim that something has the second property just in case it is characterized by a corresponding instance. What I do not understand is Lowe's identification of the first property with the second. In fact, I think this identification leads to trouble for Lowe. Imagine a world with nothing but a lonely rubber eraser. Suppose it is never stretched. Can we still say that it is stretchable? Not on the current account. For, if it is never stretched, there is no property instance. If there is no property instance, there is no property, since Lowe explicitly rejects uninstantiated universals. (p.99) But if there is no property to characterize the eraser's kind, it is not stretchable. The problem, in short, is that while Lowe can allow that something is disposed to stretch without ever being stretched, he cannot allow that something is disposed to stretch without anything ever being stretched. Many, I take it, will find this result unacceptable.

Let us forget about the identification issue and focus on the idea that something is disposed to φ if and only if its kind φs. This gets many cases right (e.g., the eraser is disposed to stretch since rubber stretches). But there are potential counterexamples in each direction. Right-to-left: Lions hunt, but a domesticated lion is not disposed to hunt. Left-to-right: A car made of salt is disposed to dissolve in water, but cars don't dissolve in water. Perhaps the salt car's kind is salt rather than car? Perhaps, but then I would like to hear more about what determines an object's kind -- a topic on which Lowe has little to say in this book. (I would also like to hear more about why Lowe treats mass terms like 'salt' and count nouns like 'car' as corresponding to a single ontological category, but that is another story.) The more general worry here is that, on Lowe's account, all objects of the same kind must have the same dispositions. But that seems patently false, at least if we focus on kinds like car, lion or person.

Suppose that all of the foregoing worries can be answered. Grant Lowe his theory of what it is to ascribe dispositions to objects. I am still not convinced that we have a satisfactory account, for the dispositional-categorical distinction also applies at the level of kinds. Benzene is flammable. Benzene is made of carbon and hydrogen. The first statement is dispositional in nature; the second is categorical. Yet Lowe's account cannot make sense of this, for there is only one "route" from kinds to attributes in his system.

This concludes my discussion of laws and dispositions. Lowe does not provide us with any other reason to postulate kinds or attributes (or objects) in the book, but he does suggest two further arguments for modes (tropes). I will discuss these arguments briefly in closing.

Lowe first suggests that modes are motivated on the grounds that they are required as the immediate objects of perception. The argument is familiar from the writings of Boethius, D.C. Williams and many modern day trope theorists (none of whom are cited by Lowe). One sees a rose by seeing its color. If this color were a universal, one would thereby see the color had by many other exactly resembling flowers. Lowe finds this conclusion absurd, but does not say why. Suppose we add the further premise that perceiving a property of an object is sufficient for perceiving the object itself. Seeing one rose would then suffice for seeing many -- an absurd conclusion indeed. The color of the rose must therefore be a particularized property, rather than a universal. This argument is suggestive, but not conclusive. I can see a river in one location without seeing it in another, even if there is a single river flowing from one place to the next. In the same way, one might think it is possible to see a universal "in" one object (or location) without seeing that same universal "in" another. More generally, one might take the relation of perceiving to be (at least) a three-place relation between an observer, a universal, and an object (or location). One could then perceive redness in one rose without perceiving that same universal in another -- and thus without perceiving the other rose at all.

Lowe's second argument is that modes are required as truthmakers for contingent predicative truths. Lowe begins with the traditional truthmaker principle, according to which every truth has a truthmaker (something whose existence is sufficient for the truth of the corresponding statement). The advocate of truthmaking faces a challenge: what is the truthmaker for this apple is red? It cannot be the apple, since its existence does not suffice for its being red. Nor can it be the general attribute of redness, since its existence does not even guarantee the presence of the apple. Those who follow David Armstrong reply that the truthmaker we seek is a certain state-of-affairs: this apple's being red. Lowe dismisses this as "mystery-mongering to no good purpose, brought about simply because the philosophers in question have tried to do without one of the fundamental categories of being." (p.204) Lowe's own suggestion, of course, is that what makes it the case that this apple is red is the mode of redness that uniquely characterizes this apple. (This is the same answer given by Kevin Mulligan, Peter Simons, and Barry Smith, none of whom is cited by Lowe.) According to Lowe, it is part of this mode's essence to characterize this apple, so its existence is sufficient for the truth in question. Armstrong would no doubt reply that this is "mystery-mongering" to no good purpose, brought about simply because Lowe has tried to do without states-of-affairs. Set that aside. The real problem is that there are many contingent truths without matching modes. I offer two examples. First: There are no unicorns. This is true, but there is no mode whose existence makes it true. (One might, of course, appeal to "totality" facts or "negative" states-of-affairs in an effort to reconcile negative existentials with the truthmaker principle. But then it is tempting to forget about modes altogether and opt for a uniform account of truthmaking in terms of facts or states-of-affairs.) Second example: Benzene is flammable. On Lowe's account, laws like this consist in a substantial kind being characterized by a universal attribute. There is no mode in this case, so what is the truthmaker? If the law were necessary, then Benzene could serve as a truthmaker itself, since flammability would be essential to the kind. (p.170) But what if the law is contingent, as Lowe explicitly allows? (p.171) In that case the existence of the kind is not sufficient for the truth of the law statement. Nor is the existence of the attribute. Objects and modes are clearly inadequate, so Lowe is left without truthmakers for contingent laws. The upshot, it seems, is that the theory of laws and dispositions developed in Part III of the book is inconsistent with what Lowe has to say about truthmaking in Part IV.