The Fourfold: Reading the Late Heidegger

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Andrew J. Mitchell, The Fourfold: Reading the Late Heidegger, Northwestern University Press, 2015, 372pp., $34.95 (pbk), IBSN 9780810130760.

Reviewed by Gary E. Aylesworth, Eastern Illinois University


In this volume, Andrew J. Mitchell examines the fourfold (das Geviert) as the key to Heidegger’s later thinking. This motif is introduced for the first time in the Bremen Lectures of 1949 (which Mitchell translated into English), in reference to the thing as a gathering of earth, sky, mortals and divinities. Mitchell extends this conception of the thing as a gathering of relations to show that the later Heidegger steps beyond his treatment of things in Being and Time, and that he conceives things, not just Dasein, as ecstatically open and exposed to one another in the mirror-play of the world.

For Mitchell’s reading, it is crucial to understand the technological essence (das Gestell) as ‘positionality’ (or circulative replacement) rather than its commonly accepted translation, ‘the enframing’. As Mitchell remarks: “We cannot think positionality as some kind of framework or scaffolding thrown over the world” (50). “Positionality” places emphasis upon Gestell as an active way of being, similar to William J. Richardson’s rendering of the term as ‘pos-ure’ in his translation of the Spiegel interview. As the way of being in the technological epoch, positionality is inseparable from the fourfold, and provides the basis from which the fourfold is to be thought.

Overall, Mitchell’s approach is systematic rather than historical. As he says, “I am attempting to begin with the fourfold and unpack its import through interpretations of the texts that first present it” (7). He does not, therefore, attempt to trace the development of the fourfold out of Heidegger’s earlier writings. He does, however, work from a tripartite periodization of Heidegger’s thinking, the early phase of which extends from 1912 to 1932, including Being and Time (1927), with the middle period dating from 1933-1944, with Contributions to Philosophy as its main work, and the later period extending from 1945-1976, with The Bremen Lectures as its organizing work. This approach, naturally, is both productive and limiting. The strength of Mitchell’s interpretation is his connection of the fourfold with positionality, and the illuminating coherence this connection allows him to develop. This having been said, such an “internal” study does not address outstanding issues such as the alleged “anti-Semitism” of Heidegger’s thinking or his privileging of a certain Greco-German tradition.

Chapter 1 sets forth the thesis that Heidegger’s sense of the technological is no mere opposition between representational objectivity and the thing’s essential being, but consists of a tension between two different departures from objectivity: the thing as a nexus of relations, and its availability as standing reserve. Its availability already takes the thing beyond itself and positions it within a circuit of consumption and replacement. In this regard, the thing is never fully present and does not rest in itself, nor is its being as standing reserve rendered into a whole. Instead, things are “pieces” without a whole to mediate their relations, and thus the thing is obliterated in the immediacy of its “orderability.” As Mitchell argues, in the availability of things “nothing is held back,” there is no difference between concealment and unconcealment, and therefore there is nothing to resist the movement of requisitioning (45). Hence what is called “standing reserve” (das Bestand) does not stand at all, but is at the ready and always displaced toward somewhere else. This displacement is the being of the standing reserve insofar as being “pursues” itself by setting itself into circulation.

This is the sense in which “Beying is unqualifiedly in itself, from itself, for itself, the danger” (57). On Mitchell’s reading, the danger lies in the one-sidedness that comes about through the forgetting of being as the medium of appearance (the world), so that “beying” shows itself only as positionality. However, humans stand in a more original relation to being, and can therefore never become standing reserve without remainder. In them, "a trace of the thing persists " (63), and the fourfold is Heidegger’s attempt to recover this trace in the midst of positionality. In the subsequent chapters, Mitchell takes up each aspect of the fourfold in light of its “mirror play” with the others, and gathered together in the appearing of the thing.

In Chapter 2, Mitchell reads “The Origin of the Work of Art” as Heidegger’s point of departure for thinking the earth as the withdrawal of the ground of the world. In his readings of Rilke and Hölderlin, Heidegger re-thinks the “weight” of the earth not as heaviness, but as an auspiciousness of the relations between things (82). Mitchell’s approach to this motif brings his reading into close proximity to Jean-Luc Nancy, who, in “The Weight of a Thought,” explores the sensible in the intelligible and the intelligible in the sensible. Their belonging together is inappropriable and necessary, and this is the sense Mitchell assigns to “earth”: neither merely sensible nor material, it is an attunement (Bestimmung) that irreducibly intertwines appearance and meaning.

This attunement is extended, in turn, to the later Heidegger’s meditations on “stones” (Gestein), “waters” (Gewässer), “plants” (Gewächs), and “animals” (Getier). In each case, Mitchell reads these notions as relational, that is, as standing out from themselves and toward one another in relations of mutual belonging and appearing. Of particular importance is Heidegger’s rethinking of the relation between the animal and the human, which he develops in a reading of the blue deer appearing in Trakl’s poem “Sommersneige.” The blue deer does not rest in mere animality, but transforms itself in recollecting its path, and its blueness signifies a relation to the human. In Heidegger’s words, “The name ‘blue deer’ names the mortal” (On the Way to Language).

The association of blueness with mortality introduces the background for Heidegger’s statements on death in The Bremen Lectures, where he talks of the victims of the Holocaust as “pieces of inventory of a standing reserve for the fabrication of corpses,” whose annihilation is not the death of mortals. Instead, mortality is “blue” in the sense of exposure in the medium of the mirror-play of the world. This also means that mortality is no longer the being-toward-death that singularizes Dasein in Being and Time, but opens the human to the animal that also exists beyond itself in the relationality of the fourfold. Hence, contrary to Being and Time, mortality is an opening to the world rather than a removal from it, and it takes the human toward that which the human can never make its “own.”

The blueness of mortality also refers to the expanse of the sky, which Mitchell takes up in Chapter 3. Working from Heidegger’s readings of Hölderlin, Mitchell notes that “Blue is the color between presence and absence, between day and night,” and it is the trace of darkness in the midst of light and light in the midst of darkness (139). The task of the poet is to render these traces into the language of a historical people, joining them together in a shared epoch of temporality. The sky is the medium of interplay between the hours of the day and the seasons of the year. These hours and seasons are not serially successive, but times of fruition and fulfillment that constantly relate to one another.

In Chapter 4, Mitchell extends the notion of being as a medium between presence and absence to Heidegger’s statements on the meaning of “divinities.” As Mitchell argues, Heidegger finds in Hölderlin a sense of divinity that surpasses the death or absence of God announced by Nietzsche (163). Here, divinities are messengers bearing meaningfulness into things in their very nature. Such meaningfulness can never be explicitly settled and stated, but remains a hinting (Winken) structured by the gesture of giving and receiving the message. In this regard, the gods are this gesture of mediation between humans and meaningfulness (167). The hint is not a metaphysical representation, but a call to meaningfulness without a meaning that can be specifically stated. But since meaning is never entirely absent, Heidegger speaks of “the last God” as the God who is always arriving, but will never come into full presence (170). This God is therefore not last in any serial chronology, but last in the interminability of its arrival. This sense of the last God also intrinsically binds things to a “beyond” in relation to which they continually surpass themselves.

Chapter 5 extends the notion of beying as an opening to mortality allowing humans to “be” the mortals in the first place. Mitchell notes that mortality in the later Heidegger is equally singularizing and pluralizing. By naming human beings “die Sterbliche,” instead of “Dasein,” Heidegger shifts the sense of the human from being to dying. Furthermore, says Mitchell, “A community of mortals is thus written into the very name” (212), thus answering an unresolved issue from Being and Time: the possibility of a “proper” community in contrast with the “improper” and anonymous “They” (das Man). The community of mortals is the original and constituting nexus of relations upon which societies are built and where humans find their singularizing limit.

After discussing Heidegger’s critiques of Rilke, Jünger and Nietzsche on the nature of the human (all are still metaphysical), Mitchell develops the sense of death as an enabling medium in a reading close to that of Françoise Dastur. Here, mortality means relating to death in such as way as to not yet be the mortals, so that mortality is this relation of not-yet-being, a giving and receiving of death that is never finished and complete. Furthermore, the ever-oscillating presence/non-presence of death opens mortals to language as a way of marking its trace, and constitutes mortality as “dwelling” in the sense of exposure to others and to the radiance of things. Mitchell interprets Heidegger’s term Gelassenheit to mean saying “yes” to this open exposure and “no” to the self-enclosure of technological positionality (257).

In Chapter 6, Mitchell returns to the notion of the thing Heidegger introduces in The Bremen Lectures. Here, he explores Heidegger’s statement that “the thing is slight (gering).” It is nothing substantive, but a mirror-play that is an expropriating mirroring-out, a relationality without independently existing relata (the abyssal spatializing and temporalizing of the world). As Mitchell notes, Heidegger calls thinking in relation to the thing ‘Andenken’, which is not a remembrance of the past, but a way of thinking the non-presence of things from where they begin their presencing (An-wesen), from this ‘An-’ itself" (286). The “An-” of Andenken and Anwesen is the place between presence and absence, the place of jointure (Fügen) where the thing abides. In this regard, the slightness of the thing is its sheltering from complete presence, and its preservation from technological requisitioning.

The volume concludes with a discussion of Heidegger’s cryptic pronouncement in The Bremen Lectures that “things have never yet been as things.” This is so because the essence of the thing has been forgotten. As not-yet, the arrival of the thing beckons to its granting, where granting is at the same time the challenge of technological replaceability. As Mitchell remarks, “The same challenge that would reduce the thing to nothing simultaneously protects it from being anything” (312). This means the early Heidegger’s “ontological difference” is superseded by the fourfold, where the difference between being and beings is released into the medium of the world and the not-yet-being of things. In its way, then, the difference between positionality and granting would itself be “slight” — a difference in a modality of relating that addresses us as only as a hint and a trace.

Mitchell’s account is the most comprehensive and illuminating study of the later Heidegger to date, and it should help put to rest the notion that Heidegger’s project is the recovery or anticipation of a sense of “being” that can be stated. It will not, however, put to rest the moral-political controversies that are, themselves, ways Heidegger’s thinking appears in the world. The interminability of these controversies is, perhaps, a sign that the matter of thinking is never a closed question.