The Fragmentation of Being

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Kris McDaniel, The Fragmentation of Being, Oxford University Press, 2017, 320pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198719656.

Reviewed by Nicholas Stang, University of Toronto


Once upon a time, undergraduates were taught that the heroic efforts of Frege, Russell, and Quine had beaten back a formerly powerful superstition, the mysterious and obscure doctrine that there are different modes of existence. Existence, they were patiently told, is expressed through the existential quantifier; to exist is to be the value of a variable bound by that quantifier. The undergraduates were not completely convinced by this, and they reported to their instructors that, nonetheless, it seemed intuitive to them that the existence of an abstract object like a number is just a categorically different matter than the existence of a concrete object like a table or a chair (they were upper-level students so they knew how much their instructors loved to talk about tables and chairs). To this their instructors responded that the existence of numbers is expressed by the sentence '∃x(Number(x))' and the existence of tables is expressed by the sentence '∃x(Table(x)).' The difference is in the predicates, not the quantifiers. So while there may be different kinds of existents there is only one mode of existence. The undergraduates were quieted, and some of them grew up to be instructors and, in turn, taught the next generation of students how to combat the heresy of distinct modes of existence.[1]

In his richly detailed, intriguing new book Kris McDaniel speaks up for heresy. Existence is not unitary, according to McDaniel; it fragments into distinct modes. The book has three main aims. First, to articulate the thesis of the fragmentation of being and show that it is coherent and defensible. Second, to display the relevance of the history of philosophy to contemporary metaphysics. McDaniel does this in part by arguing that, within a larger historical context, it is recent metaphysicians (the instructors in my little parable) who are the outliers in rejecting modes of being. McDaniel draws on a truly impressive range of historical thinkers who have uphold views in the vicinity of his, including, but not limited to, Aristotle, Nāgārjuna, Aquinas, Suárez, Descartes, Baumgarten, Kant, Husserl, Heidegger, Bolzano, Brentano, and Meinong.

McDaniel's third and final aim is to apply this idea, that being fragments, to a host of other metaphysical issues. After an initial exposition of what the fragmentation of being means (Ch. 1), McDaniel goes on to discuss the historical doctrine that being is 'analogous' rather than 'univocal' (Ch. 2), where he develops a conception of what it is for a notion to be 'analogous' and develops several ontologies on which being is, indeed, analogous. In Ch. 3 he articulates some tests for whether a notion is analogous rather than univocal. If the notion has different addicities (e.g. being a 1-place property as opposed to a 2-place relation) in different domains, or obeys different axioms in different domains, these are good signs that we are dealing with multiple distinct notions in these different domains, which are unified analogously, if at all. For instance, if existence and predication are 1-place for present objects but 2-place for past objects (i.e. present objects exist simpliciter, past objects exist at a time; present objects have properties simpliciter, past objects have them at times), it is plausible that being-past and being-present are distinct modes of being. Ch. 4 explores the relation between modes of being and ontological categories, and Ch. 5 applies the framework of modes of being to argue that 'almost nothings' (e.g. shadows, holes, absences, etc.) have a highly derivative mode of being McDaniel calls 'beings by courtesy.' Ch. 6 considers what mode of being persons have, and expresses skepticism as to whether there are any good reasons to think our mode of being (that of persons) is especially fundamental (we might not be much better than beings by courtesy). In Ch. 7 McDaniel defends another doctrine thought heretical by many analytic philosophers: that being comes in degrees, that some beings are more 'real' than others. He does so by arguing that 'degrees of being' are just 'degrees of naturalness' (accepted by many post-Lewisian metaphysicians) in another guise. The final two chapters consider the relation between modes of beings and two topics that have recently received a great deal of attention from metaphysicians: ground (Ch. 8) and essence (Ch. 9). Because considerations of space forbid me to go into the details of McDaniel's intricate engagements with all of these complex issues, I will focus on McDaniel's first and second aims: rendering coherent the doctrine that there are distinct modes of being, and using the history of philosophy as a resource for contemporary work in metaphysics.

The being that, according to McDaniel, fragments is expressed through the quantifier ∃. This is equivalent to the thesis that existence fragments only if existence is expressed by that quantifier, i.e. if being and existence are the same (in which case that quantifier would be rightly called the 'existential' quantifier). While McDaniel himself does thinks this is the case, he points out that many historical defenders of the fragmentation of being did not (e.g. Meinong), so fragmentalism about being (as he calls it) should remain neutral as to whether being is existence. Fragmentalism about being is equivalent to fragmentalism about existence only under this additional assumption.

What is fragmentalism about being? Compare the fragmentalist about being with the 'monist' about being, the philosopher who thinks that being does not fragment. How are they to express their disagreement? Let us assume, for simplicity, that they agree that every thing that is (everything that can be the value of a bound variable) is either abstract or concrete, and nothing is both. That is, both agree that the two-sides of this bi-conditional have the same truth-conditions:

(1) ∃xFx ↔ ∃Ax(Fx) ∨ ∃Cx(Fx)

where ∃A and ∃C are quantifiers that range over abstract and concrete objects, respectively, and F is an arbitrary predicate. The difference, according to McDaniel, is that the fragmentalist thinks that the quantifiers on the right-hand side are more 'natural' than the quantifier on the left-hand side. To explicate the notion of one quantifier being more natural than another, McDaniel draws on Ted Sider's notion of 'joint carving': a language that uses quantifiers ∃A and ∃C 'carves being at its joints better' than a language that only has ∃. ∃A and ∃C express the ontological structure of reality better than ∃.[2]

But of course both the monist and the fragmentalist can use both quantifiers, for the monist can define ∃A and ∃C from ∃ as follows:

(2) ∃AxFx = ∃x(Fx & Ax), ∃CxFx = ∃x(Fx & Cx)

where A is the property of being abstract and C the property of being concrete. Meanwhile, the fragmentalist can use (1) as a definition of ∃ in terms of ∃A and ∃C. So the difference consists in what quantifiers are taken to be primitive. The fragmentalist takes ∃A and ∃C to be restricted (they apply only to some of what is) but metaphysically primitive quantifiers (being a number is not being and being a number). For the fragmentalist, being in general (being a value of the defined existential quantifier ∃) is less fundamental than being abstract and being concrete are. Being in general is metaphysically second-rate, compared to these more fundamental kinds of being. The different quantifiers that are more fundamental than the general existential quantifier express different modes of being.

It is worth noting how much work the notion of one language being 'metaphysically better' than another is doing for McDaniel here. The difference between fragmentalism and monism about being comes down to the difference between languages with two styles of quantifiers and two ways of stating that there is an F:

(1M) ∃x(Fx & (Ax ∨ Cx))

(1F) ∃Ax(Fx) ∨ ∃Cx(Fx)

According to McDaniel this is not merely a difference in language, but a substantive difference as to which language is metaphysically better, which language does a better job of carving being at the joints. Readers who are skeptical that this difference in language could amount to a substantive metaphysical difference will be skeptical that there really is a view here, that fragmentalism is anything more than a notational variant of monism. One way for the fragmentalist to clearly differentiate herself from the monist would, of course, be to deny that there is any perfectly general notion of being, i.e. that there is any quantifier that is unrestricted in the values its variables can take. But then McDaniel must account for how we differentiate between someone who means this as a specifically fragmentalist thesis about being (i.e. there is an irreducible plurality of ways of being that is not unified by any, even a non-fundamental, way of being in general) and someone who has simply given up on absolutely unrestricted quantification for familiar model-theoretic reason (no set can be the domain of discourse for an absolutely unrestricted quantifier, on pain of paradox), without thereby endorsing any thesis about the fragmentation of being. For if it is sufficient to be a fragmentalist that one rejects absolutely unrestricted quantification, then McDaniel has made his task too easy: the world abounds with fragmentalists, in this weaker sense.[3] Here again I think McDaniel has to make recourse to the idea of a metaphysically ideal language. The fragmentalist thinks that the metaphysically ideal language includes no absolutely unrestricted quantifier even if absolutely unrestricted quantification is consistent. The non-fragmentalist, in this case, thinks that an absolutely unrestricted quantifier leads to paradox, without necessarily having to talk about 'metaphysically perfect languages' or the naturalness of quantifiers, etc, at all.[4]

Insofar as McDaniel's principal aim in the book is not to prove definitively that there are different modes of being, but to show that this idea is coherent and attractive, I take him to be entirely successful. I think the book leaves no doubt that fragmentalism about being is an interesting and coherent metaphysical position if one grants the coherence of the idea that one language's quantifiers can 'carve at the joints better than another,' or some equivalent notion. Since this notion, or notions very similar to it (e.g. one quantifier being more 'natural' than another, or more 'structural') play an important role in much of contemporary metaphysics, I think McDaniel has fully achieved his first aim for (what I take to be) his intended audience. But, speaking for myself, I was antecedently inclined to find the idea of different modes of being coherent and attractive before reading the book (I was a bad undergraduate, ruined by reading too much Heidegger), more attractive, in fact, than I find the idea of a metaphysically ideal language, or the idea that the difference between (1M) and (1F) could constitute a real difference in metaphysics. I worry that McDaniel may have weakened his case for different modes of being by tying it so tightly to the idea of a metaphysically ideal language, a notion that recurs repeatedly in the book.[5] Presumably one can accept there are modes of being, without thinking that this idea needs to be articulated through the idea of what quantifiers would appear in a metaphysically ideal language.

I also think that this reliance on the logical device of quantification and the expository tool of considering the quantificational resources of a metaphysically ideal language is, to some extent, in tension with the grain of one of McDaniel's other principal aims in the book: to bring contemporary metaphysics into dialogue with a rich historical tradition of accepting different modes of being. These aims are in tension because it is unclear how many of the historical figures McDaniel cites would want to rest the doctrine of distinct modes of being on claims about the quantifiers in a metaphysically ideal language. I am not making the cheap point that none of the figures McDaniel discusses before Frege could have explicitly held fragmentalism about being as a thesis about quantifiers. But it is questionable whether many of these figures would articulate fragmentalism as a thesis about what can and cannot be expressed in a (formally regimented) language at all.

Consider, for instance, Heidegger, whom McDaniel uses in Chapter One to introduce the idea that there are different modes of being that are more fundamental than being in general. In Being and Time and other writings of the 1920s, Heidegger held that there are multiple modes or ways for beings to be: there is Existenz (the mode of being of Dasein, the ontological category to which we ourselves belong), readiness-to-hand (the mode of being of entities available to us in our activities of skilled coping), presence-at-hand (the mode of being of the entities of science and mere quantities of matter), and perhaps some others (e.g. the mode of being of living things other than Dasein, the mode of being of Nature, etc.). But Heidegger follows Aristotle in holding that 'being is not a genus,' which McDaniel interprets as meaning: being in general is less fundamental than the distinct modes of being. To be is to either to have Existenz or to have readiness-to-hand or to have presence-at-hand, etc. McDaniel expresses this Heideggerian form of fragmentalism in terms of quantifiers: 'Heidegger's senses of 'being' are properly represented in a formal system by special restricted quantifiers' (p. 24).

My point is not that it is anachronistic for McDaniel to articulate Heidegger's views in terms of logical apparatus Heidegger, despite being well aware of it, never uses.[6] (Although this does occasionally lead McDaniel to formulations that will raise some Heideggerian eyebrows.[7]) McDaniel's articulation of Heideggerian fragmentalism is problematic, not because it uses some particular logical apparatus that Heidegger himself eschewed, but because it assumes that Heidegger's view can be expressed in terms of a formal logical language in the first place. Heidegger devoted his Winter 1925 -- 6 course Logik: die Frage nach der Wahrheit (vol. 21 of the Gesamtausgabe), the lectures he gave immediately before writing Being and Time, to critiquing what he called the 'logical prejudice,' the assumption that logic, understood in the traditional (and contemporary) way as a science of propositions, can elucidate the fundamental meaning of being.[8] Heidegger agrees that logic studies truth and he defines truth as the 'the uncoveredness, i.e. unhiddenness of being' (Aufgedecktheit, d.h. Unverborgenheit des Seins) -- roughly, the fundamental way in which being is understood by, or disclosed to, Dasein. He denies that the primary bearer of truth is the judgment or the statement, or, indeed, anything propositional whatsoever. While Heidegger does not explicitly mention Frege or post-Fregean developments in logic, the same point would apply to them: Fregean logic, the science of truths (true thoughts) and their relations, will not tell us what being fundamentally is. This theme recurs in the crucial §44 of Being and Time (the transition to Division II), where Heidegger considers what the being of truth is (what its mode of being is), and again denies that truth is fundamentally the truth of a judgment or assertion. Since truth is the 'unhiddenness' of being for Dasein, and the project of Being and Time is to articulate that unhiddenness (Dasein's understanding of being), logic, as the tradition, Frege, and McDaniel understand it, has no privileged role to play in that project.

This is relevant to McDaniel's project, for the 'truth' of being (what Dasein understands in understanding being) includes its not being a genus, but fragmenting into Existenz, presence-at-hand, readiness-to-hand, etc. In fact, Heidegger asserts that when we think of truth as a property of propositions, we thereby implicitly think of being in terms of a specific and derivative mode of being, presence-at-hand: the truth of propositions is a relation to present-at-hand beings. Consequently, the 'truth' about the other modes of being (what Dasein can understand of them, and what Heidegger is articulating in Being and Time) cannot be formulated in terms of the 'truth' of any sentence or judgment, not even one in McDaniel's metaphysically ideal language.

There thus appears to be very good reasons for thinking that at least Heidegger's version of being fragmentalism (if he was indeed a fragmentalist about being, about which I have my doubts[9]) cannot be articulated in McDaniel's terms, i.e. in terms of what quantifiers a metaphysically ideal language would use.

Maybe McDaniel has gotten Heidegger wrong. So what? The point of this is not to cast aspersions on McDaniel's deeply impressive knowledge of the history of metaphysics, but to raise the question of whether, in letting the history of philosophy inform his discussion of modes of existence, McDaniel has made a certain assumption that further engagement with some of the very same historical figures (e.g. Heidegger, Kant, even Aristotle) might put in question: that the way to express the question of whether being is univocal or whether it fragments is to cast them it in terms of a question about the style of the quantifiers in an ideal metaphysical language. For a book that discusses so many figures from so many philosophical traditions (Ancient, Medieval Latin, Medieval Arabic, Phenomenological, Buddhist, Analytic) and puts so much effort into engaging with so many initially perplexing views (e.g. that we are mere beings by courtesy, that not every thing has an essence, that everything is 'empty,' that things have their mode of being contingently, etc.) it is notable that this view itself never comes directly under McDaniel's microscope.

None of this is to detract from the many merits of this fascinating, intricate, and deeply informed and researched book. In the future, when curious students wonder whether there might be different ways of being (or different ways of existing), I hope that they will be given this book to read. They, and we, will be better thinkers for it.[10]

[1] McDaniel tells a similar story in this book, p. 11; I thought of it independently before even reading the book. Did we have the same experience in college?

[2] Lewis introduced 'naturalness' as a predicate of properties (sets of individuals). That notion of naturalness cannot be straightforwardly applied to quantifier meanings unless those quantifier meanings are themselves properties (e.g. the second-order property of being instantiated). But McDaniel wants to make his view neutral on whether (different meanings of) existence is a property so he opts instead for Sider's route of talking about languages 'carving at the joints.'

[3] A number of them are collected in Rayo and Uzquiano 2007, as McDaniel notes at p. 35.

[4] I mean the non-fragmentalist who responds to the problem of absoultey unrestricted quantification by denying that is is possible. I am not claiming that the non-fragmentalist in general has to deny that there is an absolutely unrestricted quantifier.

[5] Though McDaniel does argue that naturalness should be identified with degree of being in Ch. 7, so the talk of one language being more metaphysical natural than another may be a dispensable pedagogical tool for putting McDaniel's view on the table, rather than constitutive of it.

[6] See 'Neueren Forschungen über Logik' in the Gesamtausgabe, vol. 1.

[7] E.g. 'From a Heideggerian perspective, the existenzial quantifier [which expresses Existenz -- NS] and the subsistential quantifier [which expresses presence-at-hand -- NS] are prior in meaning to the generic unrestricted ontological quantifier' -- p. 24.

[8] Heidegger makes clear that the anti-psychologicst doctrine that logic concerns contents of psychological acts, not the acts themselves, is not sufficient to free one from the 'logical prejudice.'

[9] Heidegger ends Division II of Being and Time by turning to the the question of the unitary meaning of being (§83). It is not clear to me how to square this with reading Heidegger as a fragmentalist about being. In McDaniel's defense, Heidegger never published Division III, and soon abandoned the project of the book. Did he realize it was incompatible with fragmentalism about being? Or was fragmentalism about being always only a stage in the existential analytic of Dasein (the analysis of Dasein's mode of being and its understanding of being) on the way to a unified answer to the question, what is being?

[10] Thanks to Jack Woods, Mark Kingwell, Colin McLear, Mike Blézy, Dario Karimi, and Kris McDaniel himself for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.