The Frankfurt School in Exile

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Thomas Wheatland, The Frankfurt School in Exile, U. of Minnesota Press, 2009, 415pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780816653676.

Reviewed by Max Pensky, Binghamton University, The State University of New York



Following in the footsteps of earlier compendious intellectual histories of the Frankfurt School by Martin Jay and Rolf Wiggershaus, Thomas Wheatland’s The Frankfurt School in Exile offers a thorough intellectual, political and institutional history of the adventures of the Frankfurt Institut fuer Sozialforschuung in the United States. Concentrating on this rich and strange institutional odyssey, and tapping the previously ignored archives of the Department of Sociology in Columbia University, Wheatland presents a far more vivid, nuanced, and strange picture of the Frankfurt Institute’s American years. Among the many entrenched myths punctured in this book, the most important one to fall is the received view that the key figures of the Institute and their American, primarily New York, academic hosts were mutually indifferent. Just as significantly, however, Wheatland documents that the cadre of New York intellectuals gathered around the so-called ‘little journals’ of the nascent anti-Stalinist Left also had far more interest in, and were in far closer contact with, the Institute members than the existing historical literature suggests. These findings in general compel a reappraisal of the Institute’s New York exile. And though Wheatland himself touches only very lightly on the political implications of this more intense and complex relationship, his history also, inevitably, raises questions about the developments that set both the New York anti-Stalinist Left, and less conspicuously the ‘core’ members of the Institute, on the path toward variations of neo-conservatism.

The Critical Theory of the Frankfurt School has always been a candidate for an intellectual-historical approach: there is first of all the simple fact of its extraordinarily interesting history, the personal dramas of its eccentric and compelling cast of characters, and of course the extraordinary times in which these men lived and wrote. The intellectual history of the members of the Frankfurt School is indeed the history of twentieth century Europe in microcosm: bourgeois and proletariat, religion and secularism, philosophy and politics, crisis and critique. The intellectual histories of critical theory have surpassed in both number and quality the philosophical analyses. In English or in translation, Jay’s classic Dialectical Imagination, and Wiggershaus’ The Frankfurt School remain unsurpassed, and untranslated German works by Alex Demirovic and Wolfgang Kraushaar document the political life of the postwar Institute in West Germany in minute detail.

But oddly the American years of Critical Theory remain, if not unresearched, then certainly under-researched and susceptible to caricature. Horkheimer and Adorno, comprising the center of the Frankfurt institute, adeptly shifted both personnel and resources to New York, where an uneasy but productive relationship through most of the 1930s produced much of the Frankfurt School’s empirical work on authoritarianism and anti-Semitism. Political prudence and justified fears at American anti-communism in the prewar and wartime years led the critical theorists to adopt an attitude of deep reserve with their American hosts, while personally dismayed at the callow mass culture of the United States, the critical theorists nevertheless slogged through their fifteen-year exile in New York and California. Horkheimer and Adorno returned to post-war Germany as the rubble was barely cool, while Marcuse, at Santa Cruz, transformed himself into a Hawaiian-shirted guru of the American New Left.

Well, not quite, as Wheatland’s historical research shows in a series of linked studies of the myths and half-truths that this received view is based on. This research turns up no smoking guns or shocking disclosures. But it does considerably complicate and expand our understanding of what happened to the Frankfurt School in New York and California, and this expanded understanding will make it difficult for some of the myths of the received view to survive much longer.

The flight of the Institute’s members to New York, and to the leafy enclave of Columbia University and its own building in Morningside Heights, turns out to have been far more slapdash, improvised and compromised than the familiar version records, and was based on deep misunderstandings and disappointments on both sides. With the genuinely risky decision to approve of an affiliation with the Institute, the Sociology Department at Columbia University (or at least a voting majority) thought it was acquiring a well-heeled clique of progressively-minded theorists, sporting both a solid background in European philosophy and a competency in the latest quantitative methods, who could boost the Department’s profile at little cost. The critical theorists, for their part, remained willfully ignorant of the ferocious academic politics of the Department just as they did of American academic life in general, often woefully overestimating their own clout. With the exception of Erich Fromm — a figure whose relation to the “core” Frankfurt School deserves a book-length treatment in its own right — the members’ half-hearted, conflicted, and often painfully inept efforts to integrate themselves with their American colleagues led to just the comprehensive failure one would have expected.

This failure — the inability of Institute members to adopt, or be adopted by, American culture and society generally and the academic culture of mid-century American social theory in particular — is once again a more complicated and stranger story now. While it is true that “the institute” walled itself off strategically from many of its American colleagues under fears of a backlash of wartime anti-communism, Wheatland reveals, depressingly, how much this reserve was also a product of Horkheimer’s own deeply unattractive will to exert personal influence over a group that was already deeply personally and professionally fragmented well before its American exile. His vindictive reactions to Fromm’s far more successful integration into both New York intellectual society and Columbia’s sociology department were ill-concealed and ill-considered fits of professional jealousy; their result was a fiasco.

At the same time, Wheatland also documents the counter-narrative to the received view of the Institute’s splendid isolation in Morningside Heights. The “Horkheimer circle” (an unfortunate misnomer, in my view) in fact maintained consistent and often substantive interactions with the broader intellectual life of New York in the late 1930s and through the war years, beyond their often inept efforts at academic integration with Columbia. Most notably, there were important cross-fertilizations between institute members and the emergent anti-Soviet left of the so-called little journals: the ground zero, in other words, of American neo-conservatism. Wheatland devotes an entire chapter to the complex pas de deux between the institute and Sidney Hook, and it makes for fascinating reading. As for the rest of the New York public intellectuals of the period — from Burnham, Howe and Macdonald to younger figures like Daniel Bell and Nathan Glazer — Wheatland records a history of, for the most part, missed opportunities for substantive and creative exchange, subsisting together with rather intensive and not always unsympathetic mutual interest. The two camps indeed had very much in common, as Wheatland shows, and his account of the parallel developments of critiques of mass culture in Horkheimer’s and Adorno’s work leading up to Dialectic of Enlightenment, and the (at that point still) leftist-inflected rejection of mass culture amongst the editorial staffs at Partisan Review and Commentary makes for fascinating reading. And yet these parallel tracks, even as Wheatland documents the numerous sidelong glances the two groups constantly exchanged, did not converge in any productive sense. While the anti-Soviet left transmogrified during the Cold War into the intellectual and ideological foundation of American neo-conservatism, Horkheimer and Adorno went on, in the new Federal Republic of Germany, to contribute their own deeply ambivalent political and ideological legacy, serving simultaneously both as living links to a tradition of politically engaged leftist critique in opposition to resurgent right-wing thought in the 1950s and 1960s, as well as staunch anti-Soviet (and anti-student movement) authority figures. Wheatland’s book does not venture very far down the path of explaining how or even whether Horkheimer’s and Adorno’s New York sojourn among the founding fathers of American neo-conservative thought had a measurable effect on their own political journey in the post-war decades. And indeed that would be beyond the remit of this book. But together with the documentation in some of the earlier intellectual histories, there are now far more dots to connect.

Given the revised version of the Institute’s American sojourn that emerges from Wheatland’s research, it’s tempting to adopt a very ‘deflationary’ account of Critical Theory in Exile indeed. The institutional and methodological innovations that Horkheimer had proposed at the beginning of the 1930s can easily appear as promissory notes that were never ultimately fulfilled; indeed it’s tempting to take the Institute’s American years as a synecdoche for its larger failings. While Wheatland is too tactful to belabor the point, Horkheimer especially appears in this history as a profound disappointment as both an intellect and a leader: as a martinet and bully, motivated by jealousy and resentment as often as by the Institute’s interests, and lacking both the personal qualities and the professional training to exercise competent leadership.

And yet Wheatland’s revised, largely deflationary account of the Institute’s (and Horkheimer’s) many failures and missed opportunities still allows us to see, indeed perhaps allows us to see more clearly, the remarkable aspect of its accomplishments, since despite the enormous obstacles the Institute encountered — many self-imposed — the years of American exile were not just a series of disappointments and dissolution but of remarkable creative accomplishments as well. At the heart of these surely is the five-volume Studies in Prejudice, which, for all its balky history and methodological shortcomings, was recognized as a landmark in normatively oriented, empirically driven sociology on its publication in 1950, and remains deeply influential. Even if Horkheimer and Adorno’s return to Germany led them to back philosophy rather than sociology, the re-established Institute continued to produce politically committed, empirically grounded sociology throughout the history of the Bonn Republic.

Wheatland’s study concludes with a fascinating and troubling re-telling of the received view of Herbert Marcuse’s status as — the word is inevitable — guru of the New Left. Here the documentation is far more spotty, consisting less of archival evidence than what is missing from the historical archive: any compelling evidence that would suggest that the work on which Marcuse’s guru-status is chiefly grounded, One Dimensional Man, was actually read by, and influenced, the New Left’s members. Of course it’s impossible to prove a historical negative, and it’s possible that the book’s impact was more subtle and pervasive than not. But Wheatland’s argument, supported chiefly by reminiscences by Marcuse himself, suggests strongly that Marcuse’s role as chief intellectual godfather of the New Left gets things seriously backwards. As Wheatland argues, it makes more sense to see the New Left’s influence on the trajectory of Marcuse’s own thought than to trace the overt influences of his philosophy on the self-understanding of the student movement, which seems to have adopted him as a sort of mascot more than turned to him as a source of philosophical direction and self-understanding.