The Free Development of Each: Studies on Freedom, Right and Ethics in Classical German Philosophy

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Allen W. Wood, The Free Development of Each: Studies on Freedom, Right and Ethics in Classical German Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 330pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199685530.

Reviewed by Arthur Ripstein, University of Toronto


Allen Wood's new book has two aims. First, it is a series of twelve essays on Kant and his successors, the general approach of which is

not to harp on the relatively minor quarrels and quibbles among them, but rather to emphasize the continuity between them that separates them from pre-critical metaphysicians, dogmatists, empiricists and all others who have yet to rise to the point of even understanding the project they all share, or appreciating why it is indispensable to philosophy. (214)

In pursuing this aim, Wood takes up topics in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy, including issues of acting from duty, the nature of practical reason, the relation between right and ethics, intersubjectivity in Fichte and Hegel, the moral significance of consequences, imputation, and Marx's attitude towards equality. Each essay is philosophically rich and brings to the historical texts Wood's characteristic combination of careful reading and philosophical depth. The essays also contain some wonderful philosophical asides, my favorite of which was Wood's characterization of empiricism as "a set of mistaken a priori prejudices about what experience is, and how we learn from it." (195)

Second, the book is a contribution to contemporary political philosophy and political debates, making the case for the centrality of the concept of freedom and its legitimate constraint to any morally acceptable system of social life. In pursuit of the second aim, Wood intersperses particular remarks about contemporary society and political life, specifically but not exclusively in the United States, throughout the book. Few of these are flattering. In addition, in a series of concluding remarks, Wood extracts from the classical German tradition three aspects of a vision for a more human future, organized around external freedom for everyone, the restriction of freedom to guarantee freedom for everyone, and the possibility of social hope. In developing these ideas, he argues that that tradition is no less essential to a better political world than it is to philosophy as a discipline.

Running through both strands of the project is the organizing thought that freedom can only properly be understood in relation to constraint. Considered severally, the essays will be required reading for scholars and students of classical German philosophy; considered together, they provide a powerful articulation of the idea of freedom as the central political value.

These themes of freedom and constraint are first taken up in the discussion of Kant's claim in the Groundwork that acting from duty has a special kind of moral worth. Kant is often taken to be praising duty as a motive superior to advantage or sympathy. Kant's critics have understandably found this unpalatable, seeing a flawed moral vision in the suggestion that it is better to drag oneself to the hospital to visit a sick friend, hating every minute, than to do so cheerfully and out of sympathy. Many of Kant's defenders have taken the critics to have correctly identified his central claim, and sought to specify a sense in which a moral motive must be at least held in reserve in order for an action to be worthy. Wood argues that Kant's concern is fundamentally different. Taking up Kant's example of the shopkeeper who deals honestly with his customers, Wood suggests that the distinctive form of moral worth that is absent in such a case has nothing to do with an evaluation of the shopkeeper's actual motive -- he points out that Kant does not so much as consider the possibility that multiple motives might be sufficient to get him to return correct change -- but rather with the distinctive form of self-constraint that must be exercised to act in conformity with duty when all of a person's other motives call for different actions. When other motives are sufficient to produce the very action that duty demands, self-constraint is not merely unnecessary; it is impossible. For Wood, this reorientation of the idea of moral worth reveals the sense in which freedom is at the center of Kantian practical thought. Freedom understood as self-constraint is the central value in the sense that it conditions the possibility of other types of value, but it does not follow that acting from duty is supposed to play a central role in a moral agent's deliberations. As Wood puts it, "In general, there is nothing negative to be said about anybody who does the right and dutiful thing because he naturally likes doing it." (37)

This theme of self-constraint shapes Wood's discussion of Kant's account of practical reason, and sets up a contrast with what Kant calls "right," the part of morality concerned with external rather than internal freedom. For Kant, right concerns itself exclusively with the independence of one person's choice from the choice of others, and it cannot be subordinated to any. Wood argues that this creates a puzzle about its justification: if it cannot be dependent upon any end, then it cannot be justified by promoting freedom or morality. Nor can it be a matter of self-constraint, which is internal rather than external. Instead, Wood suggests that the solution is to be found in Kant's conception of action: I can only achieve my ends through action. From this,

it follows that as a rational being, I necessarily will, as far as possible (consistent with other demands of reason), that the actions I perform should serve ends I have set, rather than serving different ends, ends set by others. This is a necessary demand of rational agency, part of its essential structure. (76)

 The thought, then, is that other people enter Kant's concept of right as the only possible competing sources of ends. The rational principle does not simply require that I achieve my ends, but rather that I serve only ends that are mine. This demand for external freedom is "qualified by the demand of reason that others have the same rational claim on external freedom that I do" (76). From this formal account of right, Wood traces Kant's derivation of the need for a state, and the obligation of the state to protect the vulnerable from domination by the rich and powerful.

Wood's treatment of freedom in Fichte and Hegel begins with their intersubjective aspect. He traces themes from Fichte in Hegel's familiar master/slave dialectic, suggesting that the former provides arguments that will underwrite the latter's conclusion. Wood characterizes Hegel's development of these ideas as coming "out of thin air" and lacking cogent arguments (218). For Fichte, the concept of a rational being is fundamentally that of the community subject to rational norms that are essentially universal (220) and, second, the setting of the purpose requires a distinction between two types of things that exist apart from me, mere nature and other free beings. Wood suggest that this "summons," as he calls it, does not accompany every action, but rather that "the capacity to give oneself some reasons is something that needs to be acquired through interaction with others, just as the capacity to have theoretical knowledge of the world is dependent on the I's practical limitation by, and interaction with, the not I." (221) These arguments lead to

the conclusion that the essential practical end of self-consciousness can be achieved only by standing in a relation of mutuality with other self-consciousnesses, and that the practical task of self-consciousness is to act according to universal principles shared between it and these others. (226)

Wood characterizes this as an important conclusion "which has profound and critical implications for all existing social orders." (226) The most important of these implications is that to recognize another person as a subject of rights is to recognize "the other as a free subject, entitled to a sphere of external freedom, personal independence, the conditions of a free life." (227) These conditions are inconsistent with extreme economic inequalities, which, Wood contends, generate asymmetrical forms of recognition.

The chapter on Marx takes issue with contemporary egalitarianism, drawing on Marx's arguments that equality is "a specifically bourgeois political notion," (255) to be contrasted with the abolition of class society. Wood makes a strong case that for Marx, as for Kant and Fichte, the concept of equality is inseparable from the juridical concept of Right, which, on Marx's theory of history, is a superstructural feature that has its real foundation in the mode of production in that society. Political equality, which is limited to life in bourgeois society, is not an appropriate ideal for a world in which there was a "natural harmony or even identity between what actualizes me, fulfills my needs, and what actualizes others or fulfills their needs, and at the same time actualizes the species-being that belongs simultaneously to myself and others." (266). Economic equality does no better; it is "a right of inequality in its content, like every right" (258, quoting Marx, Critique of the Gotha Program).

Wood also emphasizes another feature of Marx's view that is often disputed or overlooked: in rejecting bourgeois ideas of right, Marx is not measuring them against another, putatively superior universal set of standards that will govern an ideal communist society of the future. He is, instead, rejecting as ideology principles that claim universality. Wood emphasizes Marx's debt to Max Stirner in his rejection of the very idea of universal standards. No standards would apply to a developed communist society, "because for social individuals there is a natural harmony or even identity between what actualize is me, fulfills my needs, and what actualizes others or fulfills their needs." (266) In such a world, conflict would continue but not be structured by the pervasive fact of class conflict. Wood does not fully endorse these aspects of Marx's thought; more strikingly, he says that his "biggest disagreement with him is over capitalism, of which his opinion was far too favorable." (270) He attributes Marx's positive view to the supposition that capitalism was a transitional economic form. Wood's objection is decidedly moral, focusing on the charge that capitalism is at odds with the idea of equal recognition and in practice fails to restrict the freedom of the wealthy in ways necessary to protect the freedom of workers.

Given the book's ambitions, disagreements about particular readings of historical figures are inevitable. In closing, however, rather than focusing on those, I want to raise some questions about tensions within the tradition on which Wood focuses.

There are clear advantages to Wood's emphasis on continuities rather than discontinuities between the philosophers he discusses, but one of the most fundamental topics of disagreement is largely absent from his discussion: property. He understandably declines to resolve the dispute between Marx and those who came before him regarding the possibility or desirability of a political order that goes beyond all concepts of right. And he draws attention to the extent to which each of Kant, Fichte and Hegel views economic domination as a topic of right, and economic redistribution as one of its requirements. But all of them work with a model of private ownership; not only does each regard property as a requirement of freedom, but all suppose that the point of economic redistribution is to give property to those who lack it. Although a system of pure private right is incomplete for each of them, all suppose that property is an aspect of freedom. Marx's repudiation of the "narrow horizons of bourgeois right" rejects relations of right entirely, and takes aim at their concept of property. None of their defenses of private property are without difficulties, but I am not as optimistic as Wood seems to be about the prospect of cordoning those discussions off from the concept of right more generally.

This brings me to another question: in introducing the concept of right in Kant, and in talking about the ways in which it is developed by Fichte and Hegel, Wood's argument turns on an idea of moving from what I am rationally required to demand for myself to what others may demand of me and I demand of them. These demands range from strict non-interference as between private persons (in Kant, for whom economic redistribution is exclusively a task for the state) to something in Fichte and later Hegel that goes beyond right to "a marvelous and inspiring Enlightenment vision of the essential human vocation." (222) I can see how this later position might be thought to generate a society where "one cannot work for himself without at the same time working for everyone, nor work for others without working for himself." (316) I was left wondering how the parts of this classical German philosophical tradition were supposed to fit together; is the freedom that is only restricted for the sake of freedom one that abstracts from ends, or is it instead one organized around an "essential human vocation"?

These questions, in turn, give rise to a more general one: is there a single conception of freedom that unites the thinkers that Wood discusses?

I suspect that these differences in the classical German philosophical tradition point to different visions of what a freer human future would be. Wood's first two political conclusions -- that all should be left externally free to govern their own lives (307), that the external freedom of all must be restricted merely so that all may be free (309) are consistent with both views of freedom and its importance. But the differences between them point to more than minor quarrels and quibbles about what we must continue to hope for when the future remains in doubt (314).

These tensions within the classical German tradition make Wood's broader project less unified, but more important. Philosophy cannot provide what Marx disdainfully called "recipes for the kitchens of the future," but it can help us to face up to what is at stake in political life. The Free Development of Each will be required reading for those prepared to do so.