The Future for Philosophy

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Brian Leiter (ed.), The Future for Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2004, 357pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199247285.

Reviewed by Gary Gutting, University of Notre Dame


In putting together this collection, Brian Leiter showed the essential instincts of a good editor: find outstanding contributors and let them write on topics that engage them. Conversely, don’t compromise on the quality of the pieces for the sake of the editorial architectonic. The result is a volume in which every paper is an excellent treatment of an important and interesting topic. The risk, of course, is that the quality will come at the expense of the unity or completeness of the book as a whole. Leiter’s goal was to “show the reader what philosophy is today, and what it ought to be tomorrow” (1), a project that calls for covering the major areas of current philosophical inquiry and representing the main ways of approaching these areas. It is a further tribute to Leiter’s editorial abilities that the volume goes a considerable ways to meeting these goals. I will begin with brief comments on each of the papers and conclude with some comments on the remarkable achievement of the volume as a whole, despite some significant omissions.

After Leiter’s editor’s introduction (on which I will comment a bit later), the collection opens with three essays on the history of philosophy. Julia Annas’ “Ancient Philosophy for the Twenty-First Century” is splendidly clear, informative, and perceptive. She begins by noting that work on ancient philosophy has, over the last fifty years, joined “mainstream analytic philosophy” (25) by focusing on “the argumentative content of an ancient text” (26). This method had the signal merit of highlighting certain specifically philosophical virtues of ancient texts, but it brought with it the risk of ahistorically reading the ancients in terms of our own rather their presuppositions. The progress of recent work on ancient philosophy has been due to various efforts to employ the analytic, argumentative approach while recognizing the that ancient texts can’t be treated “as though they were modern articles” (28). Shedding the ahistorical tendencies of analytic argumentative analysis has also led to a much better understanding of just how argument functions in ancient texts, understood in their full historical context.

Annas expresses the confidence of a philosophical subdiscipline working with firm foundations and steady progress: “The future of ancient philosophy thus lies in carrying on what we are already doing: engaging the ancient texts with analytical rigour, but without necessarily taking on the specific modern assumptions and concerns of non-historical analytical philosophy” (42). So understood, the enterprise is neither “timeless philosophical debate” nor “a fallback to doing history of ideas” (43): “we argue with the ancients, but always keeping aware of our assumptions, and of theirs” (42). The result is both a better understanding of ancient texts and better resources for understanding our own contemporary philosophical problems.

Don Garrett’s “Philosophy and History in the History of Modern Philosophy” works with a rather disorienting series of successively layered topics: (1) the history of modern philosophy, (2) the history of (1), (3) the philosophy of (2), and (4) the history of (3)—each, moreover, treated for various temporal subdivisions from the 17th century to the present. But readers who get past this confusing organization will find an excellent treatment of the achievements and status of work on the history of modern philosophy, with a good number of effective examples. The final picture, interestingly, is quite similar to Annas’ of ancient philosophy. Garrett develops a four-fold scheme that presents the historical skills of contextualizing and interpreting texts as also providing a solid basis for philosophically evaluating these texts and fruitfully applying them to current philosophical problems. For him, as for Annas, good history is a natural source for good philosophizing. Neither enters the tedious and inconclusive debate over whether philosophy is essentially historical or ahistorical. Rather, both show how, in specific cases, history is an invaluable instrument of philosophical progress. With a confidence similar to that of Annas, Garrett ends with the hope that “future historians of the history of philosophy will be able to look back on the twenty-first century as a Golden Age for the history of modern philosophy” (71).

Whereas Annas and Garrett survey and reflect on their historical subdisciplines, Brian Leiter (“The Hermeneutics of Suspicion: Recovering Marx, Nietzsche, and Freud”) takes the alternate path of illustrating a particular area of historical interpretation, offering lucid and stimulating accounts of Marx, Nietzsche, and Freud as philosophical naturalists. He rejects what he calls “moralizing” readings of these three “masters of suspicion”, which see them as most important for their normative (ethical or political) theorizing. Leiter argues, to the contrary, that their importance lies in their “explanatory and causal” claims about why people behave as they do. They are naturalists in the sense that their philosophical inquiry is “both modelled on the methods of successful scientists, and, at a minimum, consistent with the results of those sciences” (77). Moreover, Leiter maintains that each is significantly successful in his endeavor, offering “causal explanation[s] of the moral and social worlds” that we should take quite seriously.

The next eight essays discuss some of the central areas of current analytic philosophy: philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, epistemology, and ethics. Timothy Williamson’s “Past the Linguistic Turn?” is fittingly first, since it explicitly reflects on the nature of analytic philosophy. Williamson begins with the idea, canonized by Rorty’s famous anthology, that philosophy became analytic by taking the “linguistic turn” by, roughly, deciding that philosophy should be carried out through the analysis of language. If there was a linguistic turn, it might seem to have ended at least with the recent centrality of philosophy of mind, which seems focused on the mental rather than language. But, Williamson says, philosophers of mind give central place to representation, which it is not implausible to think of as a general category that includes both linguistic and mental representations. We might, therefore, “argue that the linguistic turn was just the first phase of the representational turn” (108), and take this generalization of the linguistic turn as characteristic of analytic philosophy.

As Williamson notes, characterizations of analytic philosophy as essentially concerned with either language or more generally representation “fail to fit much of the liveliest, exactest, and most creative achievements of the final third of that century: the revival of metaphysical theorizing … associated with Saul Kripke, David Lewis, Kit Fine, Peter van Inwagen, David Armstrong, and many others” (111). How, Williamson asks, are we to regard this analytic revival of metaphysics: as an unfortunate regression or as laudable move away from the linguistic turn? Seeking a microcosm in which to discuss this question in detail, he chooses his own home-field, the problem of vagueness. He argues that this problem, which “appears to be a paradigm of a philosophical problem about thought and language” turns out in fact to be about the world, not language, although solving it requires careful attentions to issues of thought and language. Williamson’s conclusion that, at least in this striking case, the analytic metaphysicians’ turn from language to reality is vindicated.

Jaegwon Kim’s “The Mind-Body Problem at Century’s Turn” masterfully and lucidly surveys, from Kim’s own physicalist standpoint, the development of philosophy of mind over the last fifty years. He begins by crisply sketching his influential argument that a Cartesian dualism of mental and physical substances cannot allow for mental causation, and then moves to an elegant summary of the similar case against property dualism. Acknowledging the force of, especially, the inverted spectrum argument, he admits that there are purely phenomenal aspects of consciousness that are not physically reducible. But he maintains that, apart from these “ontological danglers”, the triumph of physicalism is complete in philosophy of mind. There is still a certain amount of “mopping up” (145) to be done, but, according to Kim, the twentieth-century discussion in philosophy of mind has shown that “there is no creditable alternative to physicalism as a general worldview”. Even though “physicalism is not the whole truth, … it is the truth near enough” (146). He concludes with the suggestion that the next world philosophers of mind should try to conquer is that of the still recalcitrant questions about the precise nature of subjectivity and the self.

Since Kim has long championed the reduction of the mind to the physical and David Chalmers made his name by formulating a powerful antireductionist argument, it is significant that their positions are now very similar. Kim’s admission that the phenomenal is not entirely reducible converges with Chalmers’ defense of a minimalist dualism. It is further significant that Chalmers’ essay here, “The Representational Character of Experience”, lays out one plausible direction of the new research that Kim recommends. In twentieth-century discussions, reductionists argued that phenomenality could be understood entirely in terms of intentional representation, while anti-reductionists argued that understanding intentional representation itself required reference to phenomenality. Looking, like Kim, beyond these debates, Chalmers proposes to analyze consciousness as an intertwined complex of phenomenality and intentionality, neither ultimately irreducible to the other. His discussion is highly schematic, and its abstract taxonomy of various versions of representationalism (pure/impure, reductive/ non-reductive, wide/narrow, Russellian/Fregean) can seem tediously scholastic. But this is merely the general cartography for what promise to be extremely interesting and important explorations in twenty-first century philosophy of mind.

Alvin Goldman (“The Need for Social Epistemology”) thinks that epistemology too requires opening new lines of inquiry. Much of the “demand for social theories of knowledge” derives, he says, from the “internal dialectic” of epistemological argument (182). Recent work on testimony (including adjudicating between rival claims of experts), has obviously introduced the social, but so have general views of justification deriving from Wittgenstein and, especially, Wilfrid Sellars’ seminal development of the idea that “the justifiedness of a belief … arises from the social practice of giving and acknowledging reasons” (185). Goldman pays particular attention to work in the Sellarisan vein by David Annis and Richard Rorty. The issue is also raised by a neighboring discipline, the sociology of science, which has originated what Goldman calls “socially-based skepticism” (190). Like most philosophers, Goldman is not impressed with the argument from the causal role of social factors in science to the skeptical conclusion that scientists have achieved little or nothing in the way of objectively grounded knowledge. Against typical sociologists of science, he insists on the “veritistic” nature of science. But, against many philosophers, he also insists that epistemology must positively integrate the results of social studies of knowledge. His own proposal is for a veritistic social epistemology, “featuring a confluence of efforts between philosophers and social scientists” and resulting in “the construction of a cognitive-descriptive theory of science that accords a proper role to the social components” (194).

Two essays on philosophy of science pose in different ways the still current question of what should succeed positivist philosophy of science. The discipline came to a blazing climax with the fall of positivism—from both internal critiques and attacks by Kuhn and others thorough history of science—but since then philosophy of science has in many ways temporized, finding no clear overall direction. Most of the best work—not much discussed in this collection—has been in technical areas of philosophy of physics and of biology, but there has been much less progress on general methodological issues. Nancy Cartwright’s “From Causation to Explanation and Back” brilliantly traces one line of discussion that has led to a striking development: the move away from Humean models of explanation and toward robustly causal accounts, although, in accord with the general trend, she concludes that we need quite different accounts of causation, depending on which specific scientific domain we are interested in.

Philip Kitcher’s “The Ends of Science” rejects the positivist isolation of science from serious inquiry about values. Here the influence of positivism has gone long and deep, so that, as Kitcher puts it, “the general thrust of the philosophy of science, from 1930 to 2001, could be summed up in a simple program: Science is great, and if we can find out how it works we can improve other discussion enormously” (209). This program not only assumed the value of science, it also assumed that we had a good understanding of what this value consists in and that our current practices were realizing this value. Kitcher, however, proposes to put the ends of science in question. He asks the ambitious and potentially revolutionary question: “What are the ends of the sciences and are our actual practices well-adapted to promoting them?” (210). His own answer (much of which is developed more fully in his 2001 book, Science, Truth, and Democracy) insists that science cannot be treated as an essentially autonomous project of seeking the truth about the world. He holds, counter to many historians and sociologists, that science is truth-directed, but maintains that what truths it seeks and how it goes about seeking them depend on specific goals that need to be set by broader communities, including those who “consume” but do not produce science. This leads him to articulate a highly idealized—some may think naively utopian—model of social deliberation whereby scientists and the many other groups with a stake in the progress of science can work toward a consensus on the concrete goals to be sought by scientific inquiry. The concerns of Kitcher’s project are very similar to those of Goldman’s social epistemology, but without emphasis on the need for interdisciplinary work with social scientists. In fact, Kitcher’s response to the charge that his model is a “utopian fantasy” is a distinction between the philosophical project of “specifying an ideal” and the empirical project of “identifying procedures for attaining or approximating that ideal” (226).

The spirit of social epistemology carries over into ethics in Peter Railton’s “Toward an Ethics that Inhabits the World”. Railton insists that ethical theory address real world problems and maintains that this will happen only if moral philosophers pay serious attention to “actual human psychology, society, [and] history” (265), something that in turn requires close cooperation with psychologists and social scientists. But Railton begins with strong praise for twentieth-century ethical theory, which, despite mostly ignoring questions of real-world application, accumulated “quite a substantial body of knowledge” about “the landscape of possible positions concerning the nature and status of morality, as well as the problems and prospects associated with these various positions” (265-6). These theoretical achievements must now, however, be seen as “preparatory work … to make possible a flourishing of substantive moral thought” (266). This flourishing, Railton maintains, requires the integration of ethics with empirical psychology and social science. “How could we, as philosophers, offer a ‘theory of rational action’ or ‘theory of moral perception’ intended to be adequate for understanding actual life that took no account of the best developed empirical explanations of human motivation, cognition, and perception?” (270). As illustrations of what he has in mind, Railton cites psychological critiques of virtue ethics and results of cognitive science regarding moral motivation. (He is less clear as to just how philosophical results might challenge or supplement empirical studies of human behavior.)

Like Railton, Thomas Hurka (“Normative Ethics: Back to the Future”), applauds the achievements of twentieth-century ethical theory. But the theory he has in mind is of a quite different sort from Railton’s integration of philosophical reflection and empirical science. His model, rather, is the work of early moral realists such as G. E. Moore, W. D. Ross, and C. D. Broad, who developed robust and detailed accounts of values by systematizing the intuitive judgments of common-sense morality. This model was later lost sight of with what Hurka sees as unfortunate turns to emotivism and meta-ethics and has only partially come back into focus with the post-Rawlsian revival of normative ethics. The return has been impeded by two dominant attitudes toward philosophy: a naturalism (Railton’s view would seem to be a good example) that accepts the project of ethical theory but rejects the idea of basing it on common-sense, intuitive judgments and the Wittgensteinian distrust of all philosophical theorizing. Hurka rejects these attitudes and sees the future of ethics in a return to the autonomous moral theorizing of the early twentieth century.

Rae Langton’s “Projection and Objectification” deals with two central but often opposed ideas in contemporary feminist philosophy: autonomy and projection. The first understands the oppression of women as essentially a matter of denying their status as autonomous moral agents and treating them as tools or instruments of male purposes. The second understands oppression as deriving from “large-scale psychological or linguistic forces” (286) that cause beliefs about what women are to conform with desires about what they should be. The autonomist view is most characteristic of analytically oriented feminists such as Martha Nussbaum, and the projectionist view of Continental feminists such as Luce Irigaray. Although noting the undeniable tensions between these two views, Langton maintains that they can be coherently combined, a point she illustrates at length in a perceptive discussion, inspired by the work of Catharine MacKinnon, of the process by which women are made into sexual objects.

The volume concludes with Philip Pettit’s “Existentialism, Quietism, and the Role of Philosophy”, an explicitly metaphilosophical reflection on the relation of philosophy to practical life. Pettit starts with a dichotomy between a “quietist” view that “philosophizing leaves no impact on ordinary experience or behavior” and an “existentialist” view that “philosophy ought to change people who pursue it, shaping the way they perceive and the way they act” (304). The heart of his discussion is the attractive proposal that philosophy deals with questions on which we are practically committed but find that commitment difficult to reconcile with other commitments (e.g., to science or religion). Pettit defends this conception of philosophy, and particularly the notion of practical commitment (or presumption) on which it is based, and then uses the conception to argue that both quietism and existentialism are wrong. Existentialism denies the intractable inertia of at least some aspects of our practical presumptions, whereas quietism denies the practical, even if limited, consequences of revising our theoretical commitments. Positively, he argues that philosophy has practical consequences in three dimensions. It can alter our interpretation of experience and behavior (“meditative lessons”), it can derive surprising conclusions from our standard practical presumptions (“methodological lessons”), and it can guide ethical action in domains where we do not already have strong practical presumptions (moral lessons).

How adequate is this collection of fine individual essays as an overall picture of the present and future of philosophy? The answer depends on what we think of three quibbles that are likely to occur to many readers. First, the volume may seem to give an inordinate voice to various forms of philosophical naturalism. By Leiter’s own count, over half the essays in the volume (those by Cartwright, Chalmers, Goldman, Kim, Pettit, Railton, and Leiter himself) reflect various sorts of naturalistic approaches (2). Most of the rest of the contributors are at least neutral on naturalism, with only Hurka’s defense of the autonomy of ethical theory appearing as clearly anti-naturalistic. To this charge, I think the answer is that, although the volume would have profited from a few more essays by anti-naturalist philosophers, the emphasis on naturalism does accurately represent the main thrust of current philosophy and a direction that is likely to be increasingly powerful in the future.

A second and related point: there is no serious attention to the metaphysicians whose work, as Williamson point out, is some of the liveliest, exactest, and most creative” on the contemporary scene. This work, which combines analytic rigor with the tradition of autonomous, a priori philosophizing is the major challenge to the current naturalist trend and surely deserves more emphasis than what is provided in Williamson’s essay. Leiter mentions this omission among others, and no collection can touch every base. But the strongly naturalist bend of this collection required the balance that would have been provided by serious attention to its main rival.

Finally, the collection contains no essays by a representatives of Continental philosophy. Leiter seems to be defending this omission in the section of his introduction on “‘Analytic’ and ‘Continental’ Philosophy”. Here he maintains that “ ‘Continental’ philosophy’ has … become a meaningless category” (12). This so first because its foil, analytic philosophy, now includes such a variety of methods and substantive positions that it “survives, if at all, as a certain style that emphasizes ‘logic’, ‘rigor’, and ‘argument’” (12); the point being, as he maintains a bit later, that “now … claims about stylistic distinctiveness [of Continental from analytic philosophy] are less tenable” (14). More important, however, is the fact that we now realize that “the ‘Continental tradition’ … is no tradition at all, but a series of [seven to nine] partly overlapping philosophical developments that have in common primarily that they occurred mainly in Germany and France in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries” (13). Leiter supports this point by noting exceptions to various doctrinal features proposed as distinctive of Continental thought. For example, Marxism and German materialism in general refute a characterization in terms of anti-materialism, while Schopenhauer’s critique of Hegel and Nietzsche’s ignoring of him exclude a shared Hegelian sympathy.

I agree that there is no fruitful analytic-Continental division in terms of substantive doctrines distinctively characteristic of the two sides. But it seems to me that we can still draw a significant distinction between analytic and Continental philosophy in terms of their conceptions of experience and reason as standards of evaluation. Typically, analytic philosophy reads experience in terms of common-sense intuitions (often along with their developments and transformations in science) and understands reason in terms of formal logic. Continental philosophy, by contrast, typically sees experience as penetrating beyond the veneer of common-sense and science, and regards reason as more a matter of intellectual imagination than deductive rigor. In these terms, Continental philosophy still exists as a significant challenge to the increasing hegemony of analytic thought and, as such, deserved a hearing in this volume.

All I am saying, of course, is that this collection would have been even better if it had covered a few more topics with essays of equal quality to those it offers us. That, of course, is no reason to refrain from applauding the book as a very useful and highly stimulating account of what philosophy is and where it is going.