The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality and Dialectic

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Catherine Malabou, The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality and Dialectic, trans. Lisabeth During, Routledge, 2005, 240pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415287219.

Reviewed by William Dudley, Williams College


The French reception of Hegel has long been deeply influenced by Heidegger's interpretation of his great German predecessor. According to this interpretation, Hegel is a thinker of the past, in two important and related senses: offering a philosophy that is oriented toward the comprehension of history, and which cannot speak of the future, Hegel himself is a figure of merely historical interest, from whom the future has nothing to expect. As Jacques Derrida describes the situation, in his extended Preface to this book (which began as a doctoral dissertation under his supervision, and was originally published in French in 1996): "We are all the inheritors or the descendants of Marx, of Heidegger, and a few others, and we often, perhaps always, have lived, for many decades, in the reassuring certainty that the Hegelian legacy is over and done with" (xviii). Catherine Malabou aims to disrupt this reassuring certainty: "To say, with Heidegger, that Hegel never speaks about the future amounts to saying that Hegel does not have a future. The present work contests the validity of Heidegger's assertion" (5). By contesting Heidegger, Malabou hopes to alter the philosophical condition in France, which Derrida characterizes as being plagued by "a sort of active and organized allergy, we could even say an organizing aversion, towards the Hegelian dialectic" (xxvi).

Malabou's strategy is to demonstrate the significance of the concept of 'plasticity' -- "a capacity to receive form and a capacity to produce form" (9) -- at key moments in Hegel's system, and thereby to demonstrate that his philosophy is significantly more flexible, and genuinely open to the future, than Heidegger and his intellectual descendants will allow. Malabou executes this strategy in three parts, each of which examines an important aspect of Hegel's philosophy of spirit. Part I: Hegel on Man, offers a reading of Hegel's discussion of anthropology. Part II: Hegel on God, investigates Hegel's account of Christianity. And Part III: Hegel on the Philosopher, considers Hegel's treatment of philosophy itself. In each of these three parts Malabou emphasizes the role of plasticity, in order to show that Hegel conceives of humanity, divinity, and philosophy as inherently amenable to future transformations.

Part I consists of four chapters, which together strive to demonstrate that Hegel understands human beings to be capable of 'plastic individuality'. Chapter 1 introduces habit as the key to Hegel's anthropology, in virtue of being that which "liberates the [human] subject from the obstacles and the limitations of that state where nature is still too intensely influential" (38). "Habit," Malabou contends, "is revealed as a process through which man ends by willing or choosing what came to him from the outside" (70-1), and which thus enables humans to engage with their own futures in a self-determining way. Chapter 2 presents Hegel's reading of Aristotle's De Anima, which Malabou regards as the basis for Hegel's own anthropology. Chapter 3 then raises the question: if humans are not the only animals that develop habits, what is it that gives us a capacity for self-determination that other animals lack? Chapter 4 responds that the use of language differentiates human beings from other animals and makes our habitual behavior unique: "Man is exemplary because the human formative power can translate the logical process into a sensuous form" (74). This, Malabou concludes, makes each of us capable of plastic individuality, of transforming our own singular essence in unforeseeable ways by incorporating what was formerly accidental.

Part II attempts to show that Hegel regards not only human beings, but also God, as fundamentally plastic. Malabou offers this demonstration as a rebuttal to theologians who object that Hegel's God is subordinated to logical necessity, without any possibility of transcendence, and therefore has no future. Such theologians reason that if God is fully necessitated, then God is fully present and transparent to human understanding, which eliminates the possibility of surprise and the anticipation of divine arrival. Malabou responds, however, that this is an illegitimate characterization of Hegel's conception of God: "For Hegel, the divine negativity, conceived in its most radical form, does not manifest the lack or the passivity, but rather the plasticity of God" (104). She concludes that Hegel attributes plasticity not only to individual human subjects, but also to "the substance-subject," which is therefore "something that develops in a temporal fashion, or, so to speak, contains self-differentiation in its very concept" (118).

Malabou also emphasizes in Part II that Hegel regards the advent of Christianity as ushering in a modern form of human subjectivity that sharply contrasts with that of the ancient Greeks: "The position of the subject as pure and absolute autonomy implies the rejection of habit, which will henceforth lose its Aristotelian significance and stand simply for something mechanical, alien to human freedom" (81). Although the Greek and the Christian conceptions of subjectivity conflict with each other, Malabou contends that in relation to them

one and the same project is preoccupying Hegel, that of plasticity, or, to put it another way, the 'non-impassivity' of the subject … how to characterize the subject as a structure of anticipation, and, by the same token, a structure of temporalization. (129-30)

Part III argues that Hegel's systematic philosophy is itself plastic, capable of being transformed by those who read it, and capable of transforming those same readers. Malabou insists, "It is not stasis but metamorphosis that characterizes Absolute Knowledge. Consequently it forms and transforms individuals, fashioning their ways of waiting for and expecting the future" (134).

The claim that Hegel's system is both open to and productive of change is directed toward those who interpret Absolute Knowledge and the necessity of the dialectic as imposing a rigid permanence upon both philosophy and the world. Malabou flatly denies the latter objection, responding,

Contrary to the widespread view, Hegel does not deny contingency … This is what Absolute Knowledge knows. Hegelian philosophy assumes as an absolute fact the emergence of the random in the very bosom of necessity. (162-3)

She also denies the former objection, arguing that precisely because Hegel's dialectic is driven by conceptual necessities rather than the reflections of a particular author, its meaning remains resolutely dependent upon and open to the interpretations provided by its readers: "What the dialectical movement demands is not a passivity, but a plasticity, from the reader" (180).

Malabou concludes that Hegel regards humanity, divinity, the cosmos, and philosophy as thoroughly plastic, receptive to being transformed and capable of initiating transformations. Consequently, and contrary to Heidegger's interpretation, Hegel is a thinker of the future and with a future:

Hegel's philosophy announces that the future, from now on, depends on the way the shapes and figures already present can be put back into play, on the way the extraordinary and unexpected can only arise out of the prose of the well-known and familiar. (190)

Malabou's emphasis on the concept of plasticity in Hegel's philosophy is novel, and her attempt to challenge the Heideggerian interpretation of Hegel, and thereby reorient the French reception of his work, is important and timely. Malabou's treatment of Hegel is knowledgeable and insightful, demonstrating command of both the large systematic context and the particular details that are crucial to her analyses. Each of the three parts of the book makes a worthwhile contribution, and together they make a powerful case for her conclusion.

The Future of Hegel will appeal most strongly, however, to those already steeped in the philosophical issues and disputes generated by the efforts of the last several generations of French scholars to evaluate the legacy of Hegel's thought in light of Heidegger's work. The concerns that motivate the book will be less pressing to those unfamiliar with these debates. This may include English-speaking readers of Hegel who are more accustomed to addressing the challenges posed to German Idealism by empiricism, skepticism, and naturalism, rather than those initiated by Heidegger.

Indeed, one of the curious and disappointing aspects of Malabou's book is its almost complete lack of engagement with recent English language scholarship on Hegel. Very good work has been done on many of the themes that are central to her work, including Hegel's understanding of habit, the relationship of his anthropology to Aristotle's De Anima, his account of Christianity, and his conception of systematic philosophy. Moreover, English language scholarship has already grappled with, and convincingly repudiated, some of the very misconceptions about Hegel that Malabou herself rightly rejects, including the old myths that Hegel's politics is totalitarian, that his metaphysics denies contingency, and that his ethics has no place for individuality. These myths continue to persist among those who are less familiar with Hegel than they are with his French critics, and so it is understandable that Malabou devotes considerable attention to taking them on, but her efforts would be enhanced if she drew on the best English language work in doing so.

In particular, it would be intriguing to see Malabou engage with English scholarship on the question of the senses in which, and the degree to which, Hegel's own system is plastic, or open to future transformation. This has been addressed most directly by David Kolb in "What is Open and What is Closed in the Philosophy of Hegel," where he argues that "an open thinking would have difficulty comprehending and reconciling in the strong sense Hegel has in mind" (34). Kolb's position has been challenged explicitly by John Burbidge in "Hegel's Open Future," and implicitly by John McCumber, who contends in The Company of Words that "the System is much more supple than has previously been thought. Not only could Hegel have developed it in directions other than those it actually takes in his writings, but it has enormous capacities for revision" (127-8). Kolb and McCumber have also written extensively about the relationship between Hegel and Heidegger, so their work affords a perfect opportunity for Malabou to forge more explicit connections between Hegel scholarship in French and English. Such connections would further advance the important task of providing an accurate assessment of Hegel's work, to which The Future of Hegel has already made a significant contribution.