The Future of Human Nature

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Habermas, Jurgen, The Future of Human Nature, translated by Hella Beister and William Rehg, Polity Press, 2003, 136pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0745629865.

Reviewed by Mary V. Rorty, Stanford University


Germany—even when contrasted with other European countries—has taken a very conservative attitude toward anything that smacks of eugenics (for clear historical reasons), and Habermas has been one of the most prominent voices reminding his countrymen that they cannot and dare not forget the errors of their past. In the three lectures compiled in this recent book he speaks out on some issues that are of great interest to contemporary bioethics, which he sees as related to the history of eugenics. Habermas questions the ethical justification for genetic interventions, embryo research and preimplantation genetic diagnosis (PGD).

This book consists of a translation of a German essay first published in 2001 by Suhrkamp Verlag in Germany, plus two sections not included in the original German text. A clarifying postscript to the first two chapters was written after presenting the original text to a skeptical audience at a New York University law school colloquium in 2002, and the author also includes his address on the occasion of receiving the Peace Prize of the German Book Trade in 2001. The collection constitutes an important contribution to national and international controversy on current and proposed scientific and medical advances in biomedical research, and will be of interest to any reader of Buchanan, Brock, Daniels and Wickler’s From Chance to Choice or Kass’ Life, Liberty and the Defense of Dignity.

In Germany legislation currently forbids PGD and any research involving the destruction of embryos (as well as therapeutic cloning, surrogate motherhood and physician-assisted suicide). But the issues there, as in the United States, are currently under debate, and Habermas wishes to contribute to that debate, considering proactively issues that are agreed to be currently scientifically impossible. He prefers to evaluate them before they become possible, lest people try to argue about stuffing genies back in bottles, or sticking fingers in already leaking dikes. He approves of the prohibition on both PGD and research involving the destruction of embryos. He acknowledges that genetic interventions into embryos are now scientifically unfeasible, but may not remain so, and speaks to what kinds of restriction should be placed on their use. Although Habermas speaks from a continental position, rather than an American one, and lards his text with references to the German and EU debates, his stature as a liberal post-metaphysical political thinker will probably mean that this book will be widely read in the US, as well as in Europe.

The title of the original German book is Die Zunkunft der menschlichen Natur. Auf dem Weg zu einter liberalen Eugenic? By ’liberal eugenics’ he means a practice that entrusts decisions about any interventions into the genome of an embryo to the discretion of the parents (p. 78), a position that he thinks increasingly common in anglo-american bioethics discussions, and one that might better be described as a libertarian position. His objection is a ’foundational’ one. It is not that he thinks that the civic freedom of the resulting person is necessarily directly imperiled by such interventions, but he does think that some of the presuppositions of that freedom are indirectly affected.

I. A ’species ethic’

A good part of the first chapter is devoted to explicating the position from which Habermas criticizes possible genetic interventions. He distinguishes (a) “moral” issues – things that have to do with the just way of living together: arrangements between fellow citizens, members of a community who share common notions of rights and obligations, public justice—and (b) “ethical” issues, identity-forming beliefs that have to do with our self descriptions that ’guide our own identification as human beings, … our self-understanding as members of the species’ (pp 38-9). Ethical questions have to do with individual responses to the most general considerations of who we are qua human, and what values direct our life history and forms of life. In modern pluralistic societies the ’metaphysical or religious interpretations of the self and the world are subordinated to the moral foundations of the constitutional state, which is neutral with respect to competing worldviews and committed to their peaceful co-existence’ (p. 40); the moral, the right, takes precedent over specific configurations of values, the good. Because we respect the most central values of others, we configure modern societies in such a way as to respect the autonomy of the individual, to protect those individual values. This is the object of the procedural justice that constitutes and protects pluralistic modern society.

But the abstract morality of reason proper to subjects of human rights is itself sustained by a prior ethical self-understanding of the species, which is shared by all moral persons. This is the ’species-ethic’ that Habermas argues is affected by contemporary developments in genetics. The various traditional understandings of what it is to be human converge in a minimal ethical self-understanding which provides the foundation and justification for morality and procedural justice. Central to our contemporary (post-metaphysical) understanding of what it is to be human and members of a moral community is the capacity to see ourselves as ethically free and morally equal beings, guided by norms and reasons. In our social arrangements we prioritize the autonomy of the individual and draw limits on the impositions that can be made on others.

This species ethics, the minimal self-understanding of ourselves as human, presupposes that we are all individual authors of our own lives; that we approach others as persons of equal birth, themselves individual authors of their own lives; and that we want to be moral—that is, that we want to live with those others in a society that is so constituted as to protect and nourish our and their ethical decisions about our own lives and how to live them. Habermas does not deny that above this minimal ethic there are elaborations of specific traditions and cultures, individual or cultural models for the good life. But he quotes with approval Rawls’ conclusion, which he formulates as follows: “the ’just society’ ought to leave it to individuals to choose how it is that they want to ’spend the time they have for living.’ It guarantees to each an equal freedom to develop an ethical self-understanding, so as to realize a personal conception of the ’good life’ according to one’s own abilities and choices” (p. 2).

The answer to the question ’why should I be moral?’ is rooted in this self-understanding that we share as human beings. I should be moral—I should construct and support a society that treats others with respect—because of the kind of thing I am and acknowledge myself to be: self-creating and autonomous, self-individuating. Further, I acknowledge morality as both the logical consequence and causal condition for being that kind of thing. So public ’morality,’ as Habermas uses the term—justice—is tied very closely to this private (individual but not particularized) commitment to my own values, qua human being. To be human is to be capable of morality in this sense. And its actualization depends upon being in a community of fellow-agents. The details are spelled out in various discursive communities—traditions, cultures, societies, constitutional arrangements, poloi and civitates. Habermas spells this out in terms of the intersubjectivity provided by being language-users: “the logos of language embodies the power of the intersubjective, which precedes and grounds the subjectivity of speakers” (p. 11).

Habermas is a defender of a liberal society in these terms. He describes his enterprise as trying to establish what attitude is appropriate toward genetic interventions of the sort he considers. He takes positions on three issues.

1) Genetic interventions might be able to be approved under certain circumstances. He distinguishes between therapeutic genetic interventions and genetic enhancements. He talks about ways in which the former can be justified within the terms of a liberal morality, and reasons why the latter cannot. He is willing to allow legalization (under regulation) of “clinical” or therapeutic interventions which can ameliorate extremely damaging monogenetic diseases. That can be done, he suggests, by the decision of parents for an affected potential person, on the assumption of presumed informed consent: that is, if there is reason to believe that the potential person would prefer not to have a disease that would lead to a shortened life span or a life of great suffering. The sort of disability for which this is appropriate must be determined not only by the individual decision of the parents but also by a broader social consensus of what falls within that category, and regulation should allow interventions only within that regulated sphere.

2) Genetic enhancements he describes as positive eugenics, and unlike therapeutic, or negative, genetics, should be forbidden. (The difficulty of drawing a line between therapy and enhancement, a central feature of some discussions of genetic interventions, is not raised in this book.) The reasons for forbidding eugenic enhancement occupy the majority of this small book, and are raised in the broadest possible context of what it is to be human, to be moral, and to respect the humanity and autonomy of others. Habermas’s objection to genetic enhancements is a quasi-Kantian one: he considers it logically incompatible with morality as we understand it. He speaks of the impact on our notions of what it is to be human and what it is to be moral. We have a perfectly fine functioning system as it now stands—inadequate in implementation, to be sure, but consistent in theory—but practices of some sorts, if allowed within democratically constituted societies, would shake our current self understandings both of humanity and morality to their foundations.

3) Habermas considers the prohibition on pre-implantation genetic diagnosis appropriate because of the implicit judgment, in selecting among embryos, about what kind of life is worth living for another. Selection by criteria decided by one side only (not by mutual communicative deliberation) is instrumentalizing of human life, and if the criteria for selection include disability, increases the social acceptability of discrimination against people with disabilities. He has the same objections against elective selective abortion, although he seems at some places to consider the feasibility of strictly regulated selection for medical reasons.

II. The morality of genetic interventions

Habermas considers the issue of genetic intervention on several levels: on the level of individual citizens, (A) what attitude genetic intervention represents on the part of the intervener; and (B) what genetic intervention does to the intervenee; and on a more general level, (C) what the effects would be on a liberal society of normalizing that kind of intervention.

A. The programmer: To impose your preferences upon a potential person, is to treat that person as an object, a thing made, rather than to treat as a subject, an autonomous individual. To impose upon another a decision about his genetic composition according to your own preferences is to treat a person as a creature of your preferences, and to constrain that person’s ability to self-actualize. It is to adopt an attitude of domination, of instrumentalizing.

Habermas puts the question like this: Is it morally acceptable for moral agents to alter the genome of future generations?

  1. moral agents are members of a moral community who owe duties to each other of reciprocity, mutuality and equality.
  2. but: the alteration of the genetic identity of another requires a diminution in this presupposition of equality, and cannot be reciprocal or mutual.
  3. So such an act is not a moral act, of the sort we would want done to us without our explicit informed consent. We would consider it inappropriate if we did it to adults. It is not an interpersonal act of mutual respect. So it is not a moral act.

B. The programmed: on the level of the intervenee, the person programmed by another, there will be an effect upon the subjective self-perception, and the mode of existence, of the person programmed. There will be an impact on the resulting eventual person of having been tailored toward someone else’s expectations.

This section is harder to get your fingers on, and you can tell Habermas is wrestling with it because he gets there by way of exegesis of Kant and Aristotle. But it is the heart of the book. He has a lengthy discussion of the importance of birth. For Habermas, birth marks the boundary between what he calls the natural fate of a person (the organism) and the socialization fate of a person (parental expectations, education, opportunities, social inequalities). Growth, especially adolescence, marks the transition to authentic personhood, where I interpret the world from my own point of view, according to my own motives, and am the source of my own aspirations. It is this transition to moral autonomy that Habermas fears is threatened by the possibility of genetic interventions. A person who becomes aware of his programmed genetic nature will feel less free and less authentic. Instead of being able to distinguish between what I am given and what I make of it, even what I make of it is to some extent given. He speaks of the importance of “the existence of a natural fate going back before our socialization.” It seems to be important for our awareness of our freedom.

He speculates that it is essential as well for our capacity to be ourselves. What I experience as being my inviolable self is a result of instrumentalizing my nature. I will confront in my being what Habermas calls “the programmers’ sedimented intentions.” These are different than external contingencies which might constrain the scope of my actions; instead, the programming of my genome constitutes “a co-determinant of my actions.” He expresses doubt that under such circumstances the persons themselves could consider themselves members of an inclusive community of peers owed equal respect—a moral analogue to the biological question of others: whether such a person would still be human, still be a member of the same species.

Habermas asks: Does altering my genetic inheritance imperil my standing as a moral agent?

  1. Moral agents are capable of forming intentions for their life plan, have the freedom to choose a life of their own. They can contest their parents’ expectations given them through their socialization.
  2. Genetic alteration genetically encodes parental (or social) expectations, beyond the reach of critical reappraisal or revisionary attitudes and entails a prejudgment of specific life projects.
  3. So genetic alteration imperils my autonomy and standing as a moral agent.

C. What are the effects on liberal society of allowing the normalization of such interventions as accepted social practice? Having argued that genetic interventions would both constitute immoral action, as we now understand it, and imperil the production in future generations of moral agents as we now understand them, Habermas can conclude that the normalization of genetic interventions as accepted social practice would mean the abdication of morality as we now understand it: the end of the liberal ideal.

In his last section he asks: so what? So why should we be moral? For Habermas, the answer lies in his distinction between the ethical and the moral, a recursion to his theme of a “species ethic.” Because of the kind of being we are, we need this kind of morality. We are beings who consider ourselves the undivided authors of our own lives. We need and want interpersonal relationships that acknowledge us to be so and respect our right to be so—egalitarian relationships of mutual respect. The morality of our interrelationship with each other is crafted upon the recognition and protection of those values, for ourselves and, in logical consistency, for others. We include within our moral community anyone who is in this sense—in the sense of holding those values—one of us. That is the species ethic that underwrites liberal morality. That is what Habermas considers to be threatened by genetic interventions, and he concludes, “if we do not want the end—results that call the “us” into question—then we don’t want the means that will lead to that end.”

The argument then looks like this:

  1. Our current understanding of what it is to be moral a—presupposes a self image of ourselves as free, autonomous, self-legislating beings, and b—requires us to treat other moral agents in a way that attributes the same self-understanding to them.
  2. Genetic intervention in future generations to select desirable dispositions entails prejudgment of specific life projects, which a—threatens the self-image of a putative moral equal, and b—requires us to act toward a putative equal in a way that is incompatible with the action of a moral agent
  3. Therefore, what is at stake is the ethical self-understanding of the species: whether or not we can continue to see ourselves as beings committed to moral judgment and action.

III. On a path to a trans-species ethic?

Suppose we follow Habermas’ reasoning and agree that we cannot accommodate genetic interventions (and several concomitant genetic practices) within our liberal ethic as we currently understand it. Underlying his discussion of species-ethic is the assumption that if you fiddle with mother nature, alter the genetic composition of what we have always assumed it was to be human, you are going to find yourself in a pre-liberal society where we distinguish between the ’real’ humans and the not-quite (or super-) humans in the way we used to distinguish between full-righted humans and, say, slaves.

But suppose we take a more optimistic approach: one that in a strange way echoes that super-consequentialist, Peter Singer. Do we really need to restrict membership in our moral community, our moral discourse, to members of our own species? After all—we could maintain a society in which the bearer of genetic alterations could have the rights of any other legal person. And what about the world of Star Trek or a rich variety of science fiction worlds, in which people with no visible similarity, much less primary genetic identity to us, are treated as moral equals, or incorporated in a larger, trans-species variety of a just society? Maybe the technological advances that allow the possibility of genetic tailoring will also enable the development of a trans-liberal morality, not exactly like our current liberal understanding, but close enough to satisfy what Habermas considers our species-intrinsic need to be moral, in something very much like his understanding of what it is to be moral. After all: the extension of rights to ever-more inclusive groups of people—to barbarians, slaves, different races, and even, heaven forbid, to women, is often taken to be the optimistic story of moral progress.

Habermas might well be able to accommodate such a trans-species morality. But it will not be a permissive version that allows us to continue on our current merry libertarian course of doing anything to anyone if parents say we can. He would be very reluctant to approve of any morality that was founded on a trans-species ethic that did not respect the value and inviolability of the life of a moral agent. He could accommodate the incorporation of other sentient rational beings capable of morality into his universe of moral discourse; but I imagine that he would insist that we accord them the same respect at a pre-personal level of development that he wishes us to accord to members of our own species.

That means: acknowledging the dignity of a prepersonal human life, the embryo; not using it as a means to any other end than its own best interests and future autonomy.

That means: no experimentation on embryos: not even for the sake of advancement of genetic sciences for the improvement of present patients or future generations.