The Future of Punishment

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Thomas A. Nadelhoffer (ed.), The Future of Punishment, Oxford University Press, 2013, 285pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199779208.

Reviewed by Matt Matravers, University of York


"Déjà vu all over again" -- Yogi Berra (attributed)

Thomas Nadelhoffer has brought together an impressive cast of contributors, each of whom was asked to consider the significance of "the picture of human agency that is being pieced together by researchers in the biosciences" for "the future of punishment and retribution" (xv). The book is then divided into five parts. In the first -- "Defending Retributivism" -- John Martin Fischer and Shaun Nichols separately offer arguments in favour of retributivism. The second -- "Incompatibilism and Retributivism" -- sees Derk Pereboom and Michael Corrado argue that retributive-sustaining conceptions of agency need to be replaced in the light of what we know about human beings and the way they "work". Stephen Morse, Michael Pardo and Dennis Patterson, and Nancey Murphy, whose chapters constitute the third part -- "Compatibilism and Retributivism" -- respond with various defences of a compatibilist conception of agency that they claim is sufficiently robust to underpin (some variety or other of) retributivism.

Morse's argument in particular relies on claims about "folk psychology", and this invites questions about exactly what the folk believe. Moreover, as Nadelhoffer says in the Introduction, independent of whether folk beliefs about agency and responsibility ought to change in the light of (neuro)scientific advances, there is an interesting question as to whether they will in fact do so. The chapters in part four -- "Punishment and Folk Intuitions" -- by Alfred Mele, Thomas Nadelhoffer and colleagues, and Eyal Aharoni and Alan Fridlund -- examine these questions. Finally, in part five -- "The Scope of Justified Punishment" -- Neil Levy, and Farah Focquaert and colleagues examine the scope of punishment when it comes to those who are impaired by addiction and psychopathy, respectively.

The essays are uniformly good and some are excellent. Together with companion volumes in the "Oxford Series in Neuroscience, Law, and Philosophy", this collection will set the agenda for studies in the area. That said, there is something very familiar and yet frustrating about reading the volume as a whole: for the most part the contributors speak past one another (a feature not helped by the fact that very few take as their "opponents" the other essays in the collection). This is a familiar feature of this particular debate. Thus, in the late nineteenth century, the English jurist James Fitzjames Stephen expressed his exasperation with those in the emerging field of psychiatry for their attempts to foist upon the law a medical rather than a legal conception of responsibility. In turn, as Stephen recognised, those enthused by the new science thought the law unable to break free from "cruelty, ignorance, and prejudice" (Stephen 1883: 124-5). Fast forward roughly a hundred years and the place of the psychiatrist has been supplemented by emerging social science findings, but the mutual incomprehension remains. Barbara Wootton expresses puzzlement that "even so liberal a thinker as Professor Herbert Hart . . . seems unable to get away from the idea of punishment" (Wootton 1978: 224), just as Hart insists on the continuing relevance of legal agency and responsibility (Hart 1968).

Nearly fifty years on, in this volume, the debate has precisely the same tone. In Morse, and Pardo and Patterson, we have Fitzjames Stephen and Hart, and although the scientific challenge is more neuroscientific than psychiatric, the challenge offered by Pereboom, Corrado, and Focquaert et al., is instantly recognisable (as to a large extent are their policy alternatives). What is most striking, though, is not the familiarity of the positions, but the reiteration on both sides that their opponents have missed the point.

Here is Morse (echoing the frustration of Fitzjames Stephen): "There is simply no question that the criminal law we have is completely consistent with the truth of determinism, avoids a panicky metaphysics, and employs moral and political concepts that we have reason to endorse" (130). Here, Pereboom: "it is the practice [of blame and punishment] that renders moral responsibility in the sense at issue vulnerable to causal determinism" (60). Finally, Focquaert et al.: "The law's view of personhood tells an overly simplistic story, and the current legal system ignores our advancing scientific knowledge" (253).

Now, it is not surprising when philosophers disagree about the answer to a particular question, but it is more unusual (though not unknown) to find that they disagree about whether there is a question at all. What follows is an attempt to understand why it is that the debate has become polarised in this way. It touches on the substance of most of the essays in the volume, but by no means does justice to any one of them.

To start, consider why Morse is so confident that there is no question that the criminal law is consistent with determinism. In brief: a crime consists of a number of elements of which the two most important here are an "act" and an "accompanying mental state" (117). The former is an intentional movement (or omission) "performed by an agent whose consciousness is reasonably intact" (117). The latter involves familiar mens rea terms (intention, purpose, recklessness, sometimes negligence). Assuming an agent acts (for example, his movement is not the result of a convulsion) with an appropriate accompanying mental state (for example, intentionally) in performing a criminal wrong, then he is responsible for that wrong. However, he may not be liable for it, as the transition from responsibility to liability can be blocked by a justificatory or excusatory defence. A justification may be found, for example, in acting in self-defence and an excuse, for example, in being insane at the time of the act or in being compelled to act because under duress (118-9). (The transition can be blocked in other ways, too, for example, because the defendant has become insane between the commission of the offence and the trial, or because the court does not have the jurisdiction to try the offender, but these types of bar to trial need not detain us.)

According to Morse, nothing in the above depends in any way on the truth about free will or on the outcome of debates between compatibilists and incompatibilists. Most (prima facie) offenders are not in the throes of convulsions or sleepwalking; most intend what they do, and few are acting in self-defence or under duress. None of that changes even if we think deep down that they could not have done otherwise, that their (and our) actions are caused, etc. In short, so long as we hold fast in the face of the occasional storm whipped up by scientists wielding their latest findings, then all will be well. Such science is, as Murphy puts it, of "minimal significance" for issues of law (166).

Of course, Morse accepts that the above rests on starting with the ordinary conception of the criminal law and the folk psychology that goes with it. And he is aware that more radical -- what he calls "external" -- challenges are available, but these he thinks remain unproven, and since they would involve the complete denial of our agency and responsibility, with the attendant consequences, there is little to recommend them and much to be said against their pursuit (124-31).

More, it turns out, hangs on the "external" versus "internal" distinction than might at first appear. As Pereboom notes (50-51), it is not at all obvious what is wrong with "external" challenges (perhaps the thought is the Strawsonian one that it is impossible to imagine actually living together in the absence of notions of responsibility), but in any case Pereboom denies that the challenges that arise from scepticism about free will are "external". Rather, he argues, they are in fact "specific to the practice [of blame and punishment] itself" (50); that is, they are "internal".

What justifies Pereboom's claim that skepticism about free will raises an internal challenge to the criminal law, even given Morse's description of the criminal law (as presented above)? The answer lies in distinguishing two kinds of blame (or, more neutrally, of holding responsible). In one we can be sensitive to our and others' behaviour and what that behaviour reveals about us and them. We can evaluate others (negatively or positively) and (assuming they are the right kind of beings) engage them in reflecting on their behaviour. In the other sense, "for an agent to be morally responsible for an action . . . is for it to be hers in such a way that she would deserve to be the recipient of an expression of moral resentment or indignation if she understood that it was morally wrong" (and similarly for praiseworthy acts). This Pereboom calls "basic desert" (51, emphasis added).

A question of course arises as to whether punishment has to rest on the idea of basic desert. It clearly need not if its justification lies in its consequences. Whether contemporary retributivists invoke basic desert may be a more contestable question than is commonly thought (Matravers 2011a), but one reason this collection begins with two chapters on retributivism is (presumably) to establish that in some forms it does. Thus, in the opening chapter, Fischer argues that states have reasons to establish just and reasonable laws, and individuals deserve to suffer punishment insofar as they violate those laws (Nichols, in the second chapter, examines only the "the bare retributive norm" that "wrongdoers should be punished because (and only because) of their past wrongdoing" (26-7) and explicitly puts aside issues of desert (27 n4)).

If the basic desert thesis is granted, then what is at stake is the claim that a "judgment that an agent is blameworthy in the basic desert sense for a serious offense involves the supposition that he also deserves, in the basic sense, to be punished" (52). If (retributive) criminal punishment rests on this claim, and basic desert is incompatible with determinism, and determinism is true, then this would amount to an internal critique.

For the sake of argument, assume that determinism is true. In response, one strategy might be to try to detach the first and second senses of blame and to hold on to the non-punitive form and jettison the sanctioning one (I take this to be roughly Tim Scanlon's strategy (Scanlon 1998, 2008)). The challenge then becomes to develop an adequate account of criminal justice that is (in some sense) agency-respecting without relying on basic desert (in the interests of full disclosure, this is a project on which I am embarked, but it can also be found I think in recent work by Lacey and Pickard (Lacey and Pickard 2013; Matravers 2011b, 2013)).

However, most retributivists -- which for the moment means most theorists of punishment -- would resist this strategy so as to rest the justification of punishment on some notion of desert. The critical question, then, is whether the form of desert invoked by retributivists is incompatible with determinism (I shall say a little below about why this does not take us beyond an internal critique). If we put aside certain strains of libertarianism, then all the protagonists in the debate would agree that there are some forms of freedom -- for example, the freedom of being a self-caused cause -- that are incompatible with determinism (given that we are accepting determinism is true). What we need to know is whether the forms of freedom needed for retributivism are of this kind.

In a paper that acts as the foil for a number of contributors to this volume, Joshua Greene and Jonathan Cohen (Greene and Cohen 2004)accept entirely Morse's claim that the law as it stands is immune to the findings of neuroscience, but they make the further claim that the legitimacy of the law rests on its being in line -- or not drastically out of line -- with the moral intuitions and commitments of those the law governs. They further claim that those intuitions and commitments are vulnerable to the findings of neuroscience. That is, for people to have confidence in the legitimacy of the criminal law they must believe people have a kind of freedom that (neuro)science will show to be false. Thus, contra Morse, neuroscience does challenge the criminal law (from the inside), but indirectly by challenging the normative assumptions that legitimise it (in its own terms).

Greene and Cohen express their argument in metaphysical terms -- that, as they put it, "most people's view of the mind is implicitly dualist and libertarian and not materialist and compatibilist" (Greene and Cohen 2004: 1779, emphasis in the original)-- and, in this volume, they are rightly taken to task by Pardo and Patterson for not providing any evidence for this claim (140, n37; 145) and by Mele whose paper presents empirical evidence that they are in fact wrong about what most people believe.

If the (internal) challenge of neuroscience relies on the metaphysical commitments of ordinary people, and if Mele is right, then it would seem that the challenge fails. But, need Greene and Cohen have put the matter in those terms? I doubt that most people have "a view of the mind", still less of whether their view makes them compatibilists, libertarians, or anything else. What they do have, it seems to me, are substantive judgements about when it is fair and equitable to hold people responsible in the sanctioning (basic desert) sense. Thus, first-order judgements about desert are sensitive to stories of genetic, neuroscientific, psychiatric, and environmental causation; a point picked up in Focquaert at al.'s paper. Moreover, this is true not only of "ordinary people" (wherever they are to be found), but also of criminal law professionals (one might, for example, look at the wrangles over the development of the English defence of "diminished responsibility" to see this). That is, Morse might be right that the proponents of new defences based on various syndromes -- e.g., premenstrual, post-traumatic, or battered woman -- or other causal factors -- e.g., culture or indigence -- are making a mistake about current legal doctrine, but he is wrong to think that these suggestions come from an external view of the law. Rather, they come from worries over the fairness of imposing sanctions in certain particular circumstances.

The tension that exists between current doctrine and "folk" beliefs about the fairness of holding responsible in the sanctioning sense is no doubt difficult to pin down. Nadelhoffer at al.'s fascinating paper suggests that it may be that what is at stake is a belief about when the agent's "deep self" is implicated in the act so that the impact of different causal explanations of behaviour will vary depending on the perception of whether the story severs or reflects the agent's "underlying values, cares, and commitments" (206). If so, this reinforces the view that at issue is not neuroscience's challenge to the metaphysics of free will, but its challenge to the substantive moral beliefs we have that -- if the retributivists are right -- legitimise punishment.

What then is "The Future of Punishment"? Several of the essays touch on policy questions not considered above including an important paper by Levy on addiction. Some -- in particular Pardo and Patterson, and Morse -- point to the unsavoury possible policy implications of giving up too readily on punishment in favour of "treatment". This is familiar territory, but the collection also contains an excellent, sensitive response to this worry from Corrado.

The broader conclusion is, I think, that many in the debate will continue to talk past one-another until two things are recognised: first, that we will not be able to answer the question of the future of punishment -- in particular with respect to the impact of various sciences -- without establishing the proper role (if any) within punishment, and within the moral intuitions that legitimise it, of blame in the sanction sense (or desert in the basic sense); second, that the challenge of the sciences to punishment is not going to be (in the short, and, in my view, the long term) best understood as external and metaphysical. Rather, it is internal and substantively moral. Its investigation, then, will be best done by examining the particular stories told and their impact on particular offences and defences (causes are not excuses just like that, it is true, but causes are not all the same, either, and some might, and some might not, matter given the meaning of particular offences).



Greene, Joshua and Cohen, Jonathan. 2004. For the Law, Neuroscience Changes Nothing and Everything. Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society of London B, 1775-85.

Hart, H. L. A. 1968. Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law; Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lacey, Nicola and Pickard, Hanna. 2013. From the Consulting Room to the Court Room?
Taking the Clinical Model of Responsibility without Blame into the Legal Realm.
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Matravers, Matt. 2011a. Is Twenty-First Century Punishment Post-Desert?, in Michael Tonry (ed.), Retributivism Has a Past: Has it a Future? New York: Oxford University Press.

---. 2011b. Mad, Bad, or Faulty? Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice, in Carl Knight and Zofia Stemplowska (eds.), Responsibility and Distributive Justice. Oxford: Oxford University Press), 136-51.

---. 2013. On Preventive Justice, in Andrew Ashworth, Lucia Zedner, and Patrick Tomlin (eds.), Prevention and the Limits of the Criminal Law: Principles and Policies. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Scanlon, T. M. 1998. What We Owe to Each Other; Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University

---. 2008. Moral Dimensions: Permissibility, Meaning, Blame; Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press.

Stephen, Sir James Fitzjames. 1883. A History of the Criminal Law of England, II. London: Macmillan.

Wootton, Barbara. 1978. Crime and Penal Policy: Reflections on Fifty Years' Experience. London: George Allen & Unwin.