The Future of the Philosophy of Time

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Adrian Bardon (ed.), The Future of the Philosophy of Time, Routledge, 2012, 219pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415891103.

Reviewed by Meghan Sullivan, University of Notre Dame


The Future of the Philosophy of Time is a compilation of papers delivered at the eponymous 2010 conference at Wake Forest University. It has the benefits and defects that one would typically expect from a conference volume. On the one hand, the papers are clearly written, can be read largely independently of one another, and display a broad sample of methodological approaches. On the other hand, the range of questions addressed by the papers in the volume is somewhat narrow. For example, while four of the ten essays discuss B-theoretic accounts of temporal experience, none of the papers defend any distinctively A-theoretic arguments. Most of the papers also presuppose a high degree of familiarity with the philosophy of time. This book will be of special interest to scholars not afraid to jump into the deep end of some long-standing and increasingly specialized disputes in the field. It offers less to those looking for a broad overview of debates about the nature of time.

I will devote most of this review to the most extensive discussion that occurs in these pages -- how should we characterize the relationship between the metaphysical structure of time and our experience of it? There are two basic stances one might take on the metaphysical structure of time: the A-theory and the B-theory. A-theorists contend there is an important, objective distinction between the present and other times. They typically add to this a thesis about time "flowing" from past, to present, to future. B-theorists deny this package -- they think of time as "spread out" the way we ordinarily think of space as spread out. They deny there is a fundamental directionality to time, at least any directionality beyond some times being earlier or later than others in the manifold. B-theorists are often thought to have a special challenge in explaining why we experience an asymmetry in time if none is actually there. Four of the papers in this volume take up this challenge, and they offer different models for your consideration.

Barry Dainton, for example, argues that facts about temporal experience do not favor A-theories over B-theories, and he proposes what he calls an "extensional model" for understanding temporal experience. In "Time and Temporal Experience", he lays out the commitments of extensionalism Let us understand the specious present to be a set of events that appear to be occurring now. According to Dainton's extensionalism, "the apparent duration of an Extensional specious present corresponds closely with its real duration" (134). Dainton contrasts this with retentional theories, which hold that the experience of passage occurs after the specious present, and the actual event of experiencing may or may not have a duration similar to the event experienced. Dainton's paper takes care to carve up the different options for combining extensionalism with theories of the nature of spacetime, and he points out some difficulties for combining extensionalism with presentism -- the theory that only present objects are real. Because Dainton's paper is somewhat synoptic and takes care to outline the different metaphysical positions, it is a good starting point for readers wishing to situate the other papers in this volume.

In "Temporal Passage", L.A. Paul objects to a particular argument for anti-reductionism about temporal passage. Reductionism about passage is the view that all metaphysical facts about temporal passage can be explained by reference to a B-theory manifold. In the B-theory manifold, experiencers are stages of temporally extended objects and there is no privileged distinction between the past, present and future. Contrast this with the A-theory of time, which typically holds that a single object endures (or wholly exists) through a span of time, experiencing changes throughout that span. A B-theorist who endorses the stage ontology faces a natural question about experience: how could stages experience changes as of happening now if there are no facts about which stage is located now? Moreover, why do we seem to experience time passing, if in fact we inhabit a directionless manifold?

Difficulties answering these questions suggest an argument for the A-theory. Following Paul, understand anti-reductionism about passage as the view that there are facts about primitive properties of nowness and relations of passage that events instantiate -- facts that are not part of the B-theory model of time. Anti-reductionists often assume that our experience as of nowness and as of time passing provides evidence for A-theoretic views over B-theoretic ones. Paul develops what she takes to be the anti-reductionist argument from experience:

  1. We have experiences as of the nowness of events.
  2. We have experiences as of passage (and as of change).
  3. The thesis that there are temporal properties of nowness and passage provides the only reasonable explanation of why we have these experiences.
  4. The thesis that there are temporal properties of nowness and passage provides the best explanation of why we have these experiences.
  5. Hence, there are temporal properties of nowness and passage. (103)

Note that the argument she lays out is redundant. The first and second premises could easily be combined, and we can get from (3) to the conclusion using a form of inference to the best explanation. A-theorists who wanted to make this anti-reductionist argument would do well to streamline it. I'll consider momentarily whether A-theorists should make this argument.

Most of Paul's paper focuses on objections to the third premise of the argument. She uses research from cognitive science to suggest a competing reductionist/retentional model for our experience of temporal passage. The model is roughly as follows. Events are experienced by stages of temporally extended objects in a B-manifold. Later stages process information caused by earlier stages in such a way as to produce an appearance of passage. This appearance of passage comes about by a cognitive process much like the one responsible for the phenomenology of apparent motion identified in current cognitive science literature (112-115). In some apparent motion studies, two spatially separated dots appear and disappear on a screen in rapid succession, giving viewers the experience of a single dot darting across the screen. (Think of the experience you have watching programmed, blinking Christmas lights "run" from one side of the house to the other). Paul thinks our brain processes temporal information from previous stages in much the same way as it processes apparent motion, and this gives an experience of the changing, specious present. Call Paul's theory the apparent flow model of experience. If the apparent flow model is viable, the argument from experience is unsound.

Should B-theorists adopt the apparent flow model of experience? The approach depends crucially on adopting a retentional account of temporal experience. In "Perceiving Transience", Yuval Dolev raises two objections to Paul's model. First he objects that it fails to explain how very briefly extended stages perceive the "flow" of stages of objects that are only very briefly contemporaneous with them (61). In effect, he claims that the retentional model is under-specified, since it fails to explain why we seem to experience events as having durations. Second, Dolev objects to Paul's appeal to the apparent motion analogy. According to Dolev, we understand "apparent" motion experiments because we have experienced real motion. When the blinking dots are slowed down enough or some of the Christmas lights are removed, we realize our cognitive error. But if Paul is right, "apparent temporal flow" is not an aberration or cognitive misfire, because there is no real temporal flow. So Dolev concludes that the analogy is misleading -- we could only understand apparent motion or temporal flow if we had a grip on the real thing (61-62).

It seems to me that Paul ought to answer these objections as a package. The apparent motion research shows us how some retentional theory of motion is likely correct. And this gives us some evidence that other retentional theories are viable. The fact that we distinguish apparent and real motion is irrelevant to what the studies indicate about our cognitive architecture. And it is an open question how the feeling as of duration comes about. Interestingly, Dolev does not think either of his objections should lead one to endorse the anti-reductionist argument from experience. Instead, he proposes his own, non-standard account of temporal passage that does not fit closely with any of the usual distinctions in the A-theory/B-theory debate. While finding Dolev's initial criticisms of Paul's model interesting, I admit I had a difficult time following his positive proposal and situating it within the broader debate.

I think a better response to Paul's paper is to admit that the argument from experience she formulates is unsound. But there is a simpler and somewhat weaker argument from experience that some A-theorists ought to find attractive and that is not so easily discarded:

  1. We often experience objects as of having many spatial parts and a rich and varied spatial extent. For example, meeting me for the first time you will likely experience me as an object composed of many, many different spatial parts. You will be able to tell at a glance roughly how tall I am and the intricate pattern of colors on my shirt.
  2. We do not experience objects as of having many temporal parts or a rich and varied temporal extent. Meeting me for the first time, you are unlikely to accurately perceive how long I have existed or will exist. You will not be able to tell, at a glance, if I have recently sat down and stood up or if I am about to.
  3. Until we have sufficient reason to think otherwise, we ought to think our experiences are veridical -- they capture how reality is.
  4. So until we have sufficient reason to think otherwise, we ought to think objects have many spatial parts and a rich and varied spatial extent but not many temporal parts or a rich and varied temporal extent.

This is a weak argument because many B-theorists think they do have sufficient reason to think otherwise -- reasons that come from physics, philosophical argument, and considerations of simplicity. But at least this argument shifts the burden to these other data points for the B-theory, and I think it more accurately captures the modest way most A-theorists think that experience favors their view. No doubt there are models for B-theoretic temporal experience -- this is one of the lessons of this volume. The interesting question is which models best connect up the content of our experience with our best overall theory of time.

Jenann Ismael takes on somewhat a different puzzle for B-theories and temporal experience in "Decision and the Open Future." As mentioned earlier, according to the B-theory, there is no metaphysical asymmetry between times. But our experience of control and agency seems highly asymmetric -- it seems we have control over some future events but no past events. How do we explain this asymmetry of agency given a B-theory model of time? Ismael thinks the experience of agency can be reconciled with the B-theory by giving an account of how feelings of agency originate. The naïve story holds that we feel we have agency when the outcome of our actions is not fixed by future states of the world. So, according to the naïve story, I am free with respect to taking a bribe if it is not fixed by the future states of the world that I will take the bribe when offered. As a B-theorist, Ismael rejects the naïve story. She thinks our feelings of agency arise because of a special mode of perception or "self-memorialization" that is sometimes activated. She writes, "It is the discovery that what happens depends on our will, and the fact that we cannot experience our own wills passively, that makes the world itself appear to be in process" (162). She suggests that B-theorists ought to explain the openness of the future by reference to this perceptual capacity for endowing certain behaviors with the experience of control. Like Paul, Ismael is not concerned with arguing for the B-theory here so much as giving a model for explaining temporal experience that she takes to be at least as viable as the A-theoretic alternative. Ismael's paper links up in an interesting way with the free will and open future literature, and it ought to be of interest to compatibilists looking for a model of temporal experience.

There are other worthwhile papers on a variety of topics. For reasons of space, I did not give them the consideration they deserve. Instead, I will give a short digest of the remaining offerings. Readers interested in provocative takes on the methodology of recent philosophy of time would do well to work through Craig Callender and Heather Dyke's papers. In "Time's Ontic Voltage", Callender gives a rousing manifesto calling for participants in these debates to set aside their obsession with ontological classifications and focus instead on distinguishing models of time based on their ability to explain observable temporal phenomena. In a similar spirit, Dyke argues that contemporary philosophy of time has been needlessly preoccupied with arguments from common sense, and that we ought to instead develop models that hew closely to scientific conceptions of time. The question of how our best physics influences the philosophical debates is a complicated and important one. Tim Maudlin questions the mainstream topological assumptions that serve as the basis for our best mathematical representations of time in his contribution: "Time and the Geometry of the Universe." This paper will be of special interest to readers interested in how data from special and general relativity bear on theories about the direction of time.

Finally, those interested in the state-of-play in more traditional debates about the A-theory/B-theory distinction and the presentism/eternalism distinction will benefit from L. Nathan Oaklander, Michael Tooley and Ulrich Meyer's contributions at the start of the volume. Meyer, in particular, takes up the problem of giving a metaphysically serious explanation of the "times" that are ubiquitous in the semantics for tense logic. This work ought to be of great interest to A-theorists working out the formal apparatus for reasoning about time.

Overall, The Future of the Philosophy of Time is a fine collection for specialists, particularly those working on the nature of temporal experience. Looking to get caught up on the past and present of the philosophy of time? I also highly recommend the 2011 Oxford Handbook of Time edited by Callender.