The Future of the World Is Open: Encounters with Lea Melandri, Luisa Muraro, Adriana Cavarero, and Rossana Rossanda

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Elevira Roncalli (ed), The Future of the World Is Open: Encounters with Lea Melandri, Luisa Muraro, Adriana Cavarero, and Rossana Rossanda, SUNY Press, 2022, 189pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438489148.

Reviewed by Chiara Bottici, The New School


The book contains three interviews conducted with major figures of the Italian feminist movement of the 1970s, along with some essays by Rossana Rossanda, who belongs to an older generation. Lea Melandri’s thought embodies a form of feminism nourished by activism within first the anti-authoritarian movement of 1960s and then within the women’s movement of the 1970s. Luisa Muraro’s thought situates itself within the tradition of sexual difference feminism (femminismo della differenza), which has been very influential in Italy, and which Melandri criticizes in her interview, thus setting up a nice dialogue between the two voices. Finally, Adriana Cavarero, despite her experience in the same Diotima’s group as Muraro, embodies an original feminist thought that enriches the feminist critique of the universal subject of western philosophy with a confrontation with other classics of the history of philosophy and with intuitions coming from the women’s movement of the same period. The essays by Rossana Rossanda, who was scheduled to be interviewed, but unfortunately passed away in 2020, represent the thought of an earlier generation, one that began its militancy during the Second World War; Rossanda is an example of the so-called “doppia militanza”, that is the group of women who were parts of both feminist groups and political parties (in the case of Rossanda, of the Communist party, of which she had been an important exponent but from which she was subsequently been banned for her anti-authoritarian positions).

For an English-speaking audience, the book has the merit of making accessible a piece of history of Italian feminism. The general historical context emerges particularly well in Melandri’s interview, which mixes personal history and collective history in a very efficient way, leaving the reader with a sense of what living the feminism movement in those years must have felt like. Muraro’s and Cavarero’s interviews are instead more focused on their own respective philosophies, for which the general historical context works as a background (and this probably explains why the book begins with Melandri’s interview, instead of Cavarero’s, as would have been suggested by the alphabetical order). But even for those who, like myself, are already familiar with that piece of Italian feminism, the book has the merit of providing a succinct introduction to the thinking of four extraordinary women, each with their own vision, language, and history, in a lively and engaging manner. This is obviously not the whole story of Italian feminism in those years, but it is an important part of it, and one about which there is growing interest among newer generations.

The greatest value of the book indeed lies in its making available a piece of Italian feminism that is not very well known to younger generations both inside and outside of Italy. This holds particularly true for academic philosophy. As Elvira Roncalli emphasizes in her introduction, we cannot take for granted that the thinking of women philosophers, no matter how great they were, will be transmitted through institutional places of learning. Roncalli, for instance, mentioned that in the late 1980s and early 1990s, one could not even find the books of Hannah Arendt in the library of the State University of Milan, let alone those of the philosophers gathered here (1). Having studied philosophy in the late 1990s at the University of Florence, I can attest to the same feeling: despite the wealth of intellectual contributions by women philosophers to both the feminist movement of the 1970s and to philosophy more generally, the university system, and certainly the discipline of philosophy itself, has remained largely deaf to it, as if the feminist critique of the erasure of the knowledge produced by women had never happened. As Roncalli aptly notes: “Still, the question of what constitutes knowledge, which books and thinkers become part of the program of studies, and which do not, remains a central question for everyone, especially for anyone involved in teaching and learning. At the time I understood that if I wanted to learn what women philosophers had thought and written, I had to go and look for them myself, and beyond those institutional, academic walls” (1). As an academic book, The Future of the World is Open makes such a search for women philosophers easier for the new generations, and it does so with an instrument that can very well be used inside those very “institutional, academic walls.” One may indeed think that what Roncalli experienced in Milano in the early 1990s, or what I experienced myself in Florence in the late 1990s, is a relic of a patriarchal past, but that is far from being the case. Why should the thinking of women philosophers (and the list of them is too long to even start mentioning \) not be available, inside the institutional walls of academia? Only a patriarchal bias could a priori exclude the thinking of women philosophers just because they are women. As Roncalli herself notices later on, “the scarcity of women thinkers in the main programs of studies in philosophy—unless designed as a specific area of studies such as ‘gender’, ‘race’, and so on—accompanied me wherever I went” (2). This is indeed still the case in many philosophy programs not simply in Italy, but also in the United States. Notably, in the latter the new wave of social justice movements have brought to the forefront the so called “under-represented philosophical traditions”, but the Italian philosophical scene is still struggling to make space for women philosophers within the canon of philosophy.

This lack of presence of women philosophers (and not just of feminism) is even more striking if one considers that in the 1970s feminism was very much on the agenda of the Italian public sphere, even being represented on Italian television and radio. For instance, while reading the interview of Melandri collected in this book, I learned that Rai Uno (one of the main Italian public TV stations), for about two years, between end of 1970s and beginning of 1980s, broadcasted documentaries and interviews by feminists quite systematically, while on Radio 3 (another Italian important media) Rossanda directed a program called ‘The Other Women,’ where she interviewed the most committed feminist women on key political issues (31). Feminism, in its plurality of voices, was present on major Italian media in the 1970s and early 1980s: why did it disappear in the 1990s? Was it a backlash against the feminism of the 1970s and early 1980s? Was it because access to the universities and sites of learning was not a priority for a large part of the Italian feminist movement of the time? But if one gives up on the sites of learning, and those of higher education in particular, who will form the next generation of teachers and educators?

This is not a question that the book aims to solve directly, but rather one for which it provides a remedy, namely by making available tools for the transmission of that very same feminist knowledge, which, as we have learned on so many occasions, can all too easily be swept under the carpet. The themes and topics addressed in the three interviews are too broad to give an adequate sense of them in a brief review, covering, as they do, the evolution of the thinking of three major philosophers across the span of 4 decades. Let me just mention that, in the process, some of the most pressing issues of the feminist movement are brought forward: Should feminism be a separate movement or proceed hand in hand with others? Should feminism aim to achieve the emancipation of women, and thus a form of equality between genders, or rather proceed on its own terms, towards the creation of a symbolic universe that is counterpoised to the phallogocentric imaginary that we have inherited from patriarchy? Is sexism just one of the many forms of oppression or rather the originary substructure of every form of domination? What is the relationship between feminism and the LGBTQ+ movement? Is the centrality of the authority of the mother in the practice of entrusting (affidamento) to other women a way to subvert or rather to reproduce the gender binarism that we have inherited from patriarchy with its opposition between masculine and feminine? If that is the case, what are the resources available for women to reach symbolic independence?

These are only some of the questions that recur in the very rich exchanges collected in this book. Rossanda’s essays, gathered at the end are a thing of their own, and I wonder if the end of this book is their proper position. She belongs to an earlier generation, both chronologically but also politically, having begun her career as a member of the Resistance (Resistenza) during the Second World War and then as a member of the Communist party, from which she was later expelled. She then went on to found the Manifesto (in these days, the best left-wing newspaper in Italy). The first three interlocutors are philosophers, either part of the Italian University system or of alternative universities such as Melandri’s Libera Università delle donne, but in all the cases there is a clear philosophical intent and approach to the question of feminism. In this sense, they are perfectly fit for a book series in Italian philosophy. In contrast, Rossanda was mainly a journalist, a politician, and an author. Her essays gathered here are mainly journalistic pieces that are hard to understand if one does not know the immediate context to which they are responding. I understand the desire to include something from her, if she was originally thought as part of the project, but by situating those essays at the end, one does not get a sense of her thinking, let alone of the role she played in the Italian feminist scene, thereby leaving the reader, or at least this reader, with a sense that the book would have been more compact and still complete even without them. Despite that, with or without Rossanda’s work, this is an important book, and a very pleasant read, which will hopefully make the silencing of women philosophers harder than in the past.