The Gay Science: With a Prelude in German Rhymes and an Appendix of Songs

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Nietzsche, Friedrich, The Gay Science: With a Prelude in German Rhymes and an Appendix of Songs, ed. Bernard Williams, trans. Josefine Nauckhoff, poems trans. Adrian Del Caro, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 277 pp, $11.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-63645-0

Reviewed by Christopher Janaway, Birkbeck College, University of London


Nietzsche’s The Gay Science should be regarded as central to his oeuvre for a number of reasons. As Bernard Williams points out in his Introduction to this edition, two of Nietzsche’s most famous ideas, the Death of God and the Eternal Recurrence, are first introduced here. The Gay Science also contains work in moral psychology of the highest sophistication. Nietzsche probes the origins of the attitudes which constitute our morality, achieving a gentler touch than in some of the later works, yet pressing hard on some profound questions: the significance of modern disbelief in God, the nature of morality, and the possibility of affirming life without denying its suffering but without succumbing to the quest for a ‘higher’ meaning.

The book straddles a six-year period when Nietzsche was at his most creative and penetrating. The complete book as we now have it was published in 1887, the same year as On the Genealogy of Morality, which we now study probably more intensely than any of Nietzsche’s works. The final Book Five of The Gay Science represents the fully mature Nietzsche in content and in style, covers some of the same ground to the Third Essay of the Genealogy, and can valuably be read in conjunction with the latter, as Nietzsche himself indicates. This Book Five was new to the 1887 edition, as were an Appendix of poems and an incisive and autobiographical Preface. The remainder of the work — four Books of aphorisms and a verse Prelude — originates from 1882 and heralds the writing of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, to the extent that the last passage of the 1882 edition duplicates the opening of Zarathustra with only minor changes. Between the first and second editions, Nietzsche also wrote Beyond Good and Evil and the series of Prefaces to earlier works in which he manages to put his intellectual career into remarkably sharp focus.

There is much to review in this new English edition: Nietzsche’s book itself, Josefine Nauckhoff’s new translation of the text, Adrian Del Caro’s translation of the poems that frame it, Bernard Williams’s Introduction, and the additional material such as footnotes and index. The competitor is the much-used edition by Walter Kaufmann, published in 1974, in which Kaufmann appears as translator of both prose and verse, writer of the introduction and notes, and all-present mediator and guide. Kaufmann’s significance in the history of Nietzsche-studies is second to none. But I want to suggest that in this edition his has more than met his match.

To start with small things, a comparison of any page with the German text shows Nauckhoff’s translation to be technically superior in certain ways to Kaufmann’s: all and only Nietzsche’s emphasized words are italicized in the English, the idiosyncratic use of punctuation such as ellipses and dashes is followed more closely, and there are no adventitious paragraph breaks. (It is a surprise, if one is used to Kaufmann, to find that in the whole book the number of paragraph breaks within a numbered aphorism is zero.) These details may seem trivial, but with a writer of such self-conscious artistry as Nietzsche, we owe it to him to impose as little extraneous shaping as we can manage — and the cumulative effect is to bring the English reader much closer to the finely crafted original. The editorial footnotes are less intrusive and didactic than Kaufmann’s, and are helpfully informative. (I may not be the only reader to experience a small regret that it is thought necessary to explain that Newton was an English physicist and mathematician, and that Moses is the figure to whom the first five books of the Bible were attributed — but then some readers may indeed find this helpful, and many of the other figures and texts Nietzsche alludes to are not so familiar and benefit from the kind of succinct explanation given in the notes here.)

Nauckhoff’s translation is excellent. Often she is word-for-word with Kaufmann for a short sentence or clause — a fact which should remind us that his version was already first-rate. What Nauckhoff shares with Kaufmann is the knack of turning out readable English while giving a strong feel for the persona in the original text. The differences are that Nauckhoff often uses fewer words, retains verbs instead of creating nouns, does not polish Nietzsche too much but allows him his unique style of repetition and exclamation, and shifts him into a slightly less archaic or grandiose register (thus she chooses ‘grasp’, not ‘comprehend’, and ‘defeat’ rather than ‘vanquish’). The overall effect is hard to exemplify in extracts, but here are a few from the beginning of Book Three. In section 108 Kaufmann wrote:

God is dead; but given the way of men, there may still be caves for thousands of years in which his shadow will be shown. —And we—we still have to vanquish his shadow, too.

Nauckhoff has:

God is dead; but given the way people are, there may still for millennia be caves in which they show his shadow. —And we—we must still defeat his shadow as well!

Again, here is Kaufmann in 109:

When will all these shadows of God cease to darken our minds? When will we complete our de-deification of nature?

And Nauckhoff:

When will all these shadows of god no longer darken us? When will we have completely de-deified nature?

Kaufmann in 113 has:

Their effect was that of poisons; for example, that of the impulse to doubt, to negate, to wait, to collect, to dissolve. Many hecatombs of human beings were sacrificed before these impulses learned to comprehend their coexistence and to feel that they were all functions of one organizing force within one human being.

Nauckhoff here writes:

they have worked as poisons, e.g. the doubting drive, the denying drive, the waiting drive, the collecting drive, the dissolving drive. Many hecatombs of human beings had to be sacrificed before these drives learned to grasp their coexistence and feel like functions of one organizing force in one human being!

Nauckhoff succeeds in lightening the touch and quickening the pace, a great service to the English-language reader of Nietzsche, and highly appropriate in the case of The Gay Science in particular.

A feature of this work which philosophers have tended to ignore is that it begins and ends with poetry — this despite the fact that Nietzsche’s aims in this period are patently as much artistic as philosophical. The divide is perhaps too hasty anyway, as some of Nietzsche’s verses are aphoristic in character, and some of his more metaphorical and exploratory prose is poetic in all but form (a good example of the latter would be section 310 ‘Will and wave’). The poem which ends the book contains the lines:

Let us dance in every manner, free — so shall be our art’s banner, And our science — shall be gay!

Adrian Del Caro’s translation of the ‘Prelude in German Rhymes’ and the ‘Songs of Prince Vogelfrei’ assists the case for giving Nietzsche’s poetry a hearing. Del Caro sticks as closely as he can to the rhyme scheme and the brisk rhythm of the German, and brings real life to these often light and playful verses. That is important at the very least because it conveys the tone in which Nietzsche hoped to philosophize in this book.

Bernard Williams provides the Introduction to the book. It is useful to have an explanation of the title The Gay Science, which comes from ‘gaya scienza’ or ‘gai saber’, referring to the art of song of the medieval troubadours. The gayness is lightness and joy; and ‘science’ here is Wissenschaft, which covers rigorous study of the humanities as well as what we would now call the natural sciences. Williams is helpful as to the book’s character:

just as the troubadours possessed not so much a body of information as an art, so Nietzsche’s ‘gay science’ does not in the first place consist of a doctrine, a theory or body of knowledge. While it involves and encourages hard and rigorous thought … it is meant to convey a certain spirit, one that in relation to understanding and criticism could defy the ‘spirit of gravity’ as lightly as the troubadours, supposedly, celebrated their loves.

The Gay Science is a collection of numbered aphorisms of varying lengths, which, unlike the Genealogy, does not even pretend to be in linear essay form. It succeeds, if at all, by drawing the reader closely into the emotional and rhetorical dynamic of each local part of the text. In fact Nietzsche’s mature writings are all like this: we are led to philosophize by being entertained, fascinated, sometimes teased and repulsed. As he went on, Nietzsche resorted more to the effects of shock than he does in The Gay Science, whose mood lives up to Nietzsche’s aims for it, at least by comparison with many of his other works.

The book contains two poignant dramatic scenes which have certainly encouraged hard and rigorous thought among Nietzsche’s readers: the madman in the marketplace, crying out that God is dead while all around laugh at him (125), and the intensely affecting passage (341) in which you are asked to imagine a demon stealing ‘into your loneliest loneliness’ and presenting the idea of the eternal recurrence of everything in your life.

On the eternal recurrence Williams concurs with the view now widespread among philosophers that Nietzsche intends it not as a serious cosmological doctrine or theory, but as a thought-experiment that tests ‘your ability not to be overcome by the world’s horror and meaninglessness’, or your ability to affirm life, even though the philosophical question of life’s value can be answered neither positively à la Leibniz or Hegel, nor negatively à la Schopenhauer. Williams also makes the good, and familiar, point that the eternity of the recurrence of one’s life is not (contrary to what Nietzsche must have thought) what really does the work in testing one’s degree of affirmation.

Williams emphasizes the extent to which Nietzsche wrestles with the problem of suffering, both philosophically and personally. Some of Nietzsche’s personal idiosyncrasies — his views of women, his obsession with diet — appear to intrude rather than harmonize with Nietzsche’s deeper themes. But Nietzsche’s own sufferings and what Williams calls his hyper-sensitivity to them provide one of the motor forces for the book. Suffering is acute and everywhere; God is dead, and it is time to realize that the whole of life, with its suffering, is meaningless; but let us reflect and make art in joyful spirit.

Two other themes Williams touches on are worthy of mention here. One is the paucity of Nietzsche’s ‘resources for thinking about modern society and politics, in particular about the modern state’. Williams is surely right about this: Nietzsche is not a serious political philosopher. His strengths lie in the philosophy of individual experience, moral psychology, and in the philosophy of art and aesthetic value, and when he discusses the collective life, it is the life of culture, often in rather idealized form. Of course, this has not deterred people from seeking a political programme in Nietzsche’s writings, infamously so on some occasions, and by no means always from the same political orientation. But Williams is acute in observing ‘This was possible just because the deeply radical spirit of his work was combined with a lack of effective political and social ideas, leaving a blank on which many different aspirations could be projected.’

The other theme I referred to is the well-worked one of Nietzsche’s attitude to truth. Williams again reflects a certain consensus that has been growing in English-speaking philosophical commentary on Nietzsche: that Nietzsche neither puts forward a pragmatist theory of truth, nor holds, as many have liked to think recently, ‘a deconstructive scepticism to the effect that there is no such thing as truth, or that truth is what anyone thinks it is, or that it is a boring category that we can do without’. It is easier to say what views about truth Nietzsche does not hold, however, than to sum up any one positive view. Part of his concern with truth reflects a commitment to intellectual honesty and rigour throughout his works. But to read section 344 of The Gay Science, Book Five is to find someone not so much passionately interested in analysing what truth is as keenly aware of how firmly we are wedded to truth as a value, perhaps even inadvertently as a moral value, certainly an unconditional one. Then we need to ask ourselves why truth is an unconditional value for us: is it because we don’t want to get things wrong, or is part of an inherited imperative not to be a deceiver, even of oneself? Perhaps we value truth even through implicit acceptance of a metaphysics which we thought we had discredited (one of the more persistent and disguised ‘shadows of God’)? Nietzsche’s writing is probing and open-ended here, raising profound questions which philosophy arguably still needs to address.

The Gay Science deserves prominent attention from philosophers who study Nietzsche’s works, and indeed from anyone with an interest in moral psychology and the origin of our values. This new edition is a great achievement, which should for most purposes supersede Kaufmann as the standard translation, and which will have an important role to play in bringing this work into prominence and in furthering the study of Nietzsche in the English-speaking world.