The General Will: The Evolution of a Concept

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James Farr and David Lay Williams (eds.), The General Will: The Evolution of a Concept, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 495pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107057012.

Reviewed by David James, University of Warwick


This is a collection of essays whose importance is meant in large part to derive from the fact that the general will is a defining concept of modern political thought. We are today inclined to associate this concept most closely with Rousseau's appeal to the idea in the Social Contract. The book not surprisingly, therefore, takes Rousseau's theory of the general will as one of its main reference points. Another main reference point is Patrick Riley's attempt to show that the concept of the general will has theological roots in the writings of such seventeenth-century French philosophers as Arnauld, Pascal and Malebranche before it assumed a decisively political meaning in Rousseau's writings. The book begins with an extended version of a previously published essay by Riley from over three decades ago in which he seeks to chart the development of the concept. These two reference points determine the nature of most of the other essays, which seek to do either or both of the following two things: [1] to challenge Riley's narrative in some way, as in James Farr's essay on Locke and David Lay Williams's essay on Spinoza (another previously published essay), by arguing that other philosophers or political theorists ought to be included in the history of the concept of the general will; and [2] to relate the writings of other philosophers or political theorists to aspects of Rousseau's account of the general will or to other relevant concerns and issues discussed in his writings. The value of this type of undertaking is in both cases claimed to be, in the words of one of the editors, that "We understand these thinkers better, for understanding them together; and we get a fuller picture of the range of sources, insights, and debates on a defining concept of modern political thought" (106).

This general statement, when taken in conjunction with the way in which Riley's essay and Rousseau's account of the general will form the book's two main reference points, suggests that the book's two fundamental aims are: [1] to provide a history of the concept of the general will by showing who contributed what to the development of this concept and thus helped shape its meaning, and in so doing [2] to advance our understanding of this concept, which is to such a large extent shaped by Rousseau's account of it in particular. Although the second aim is not explicitly stated, its existence can be inferred from Rousseau's constant presence throughout the book, with the exception of Steven Nadler's essay, which directly follows Riley's and discusses Malebranche's notion of the general will with reference to the Leibniz-Arnauld controversy concerning the nature of divine providence. Rousseau's remarks on the general will are rather cryptic and difficult to interpret, a fact stressed at the start of Williams's essay in Part III of the book. Thus this attempt to provide a history of the concept of the general will that both builds on and challenges the one offered by Riley, in the hope of throwing light on the meaning of a concept which Rousseau takes over and transforms, has much to recommend it. It suffers, however, from some significant limitations when it comes to realizing its aim of extending our understanding of the concept by charting its history. Moreover, even as a history of the concept it is deficient.

In the first two parts the contributors mostly appear to be content with establishing plausible, but by no means compelling and substantial, connections between what an earlier philosopher, political theorist or religious thinker had to say about the general will -- or about what can be construed as the general will even if the term  itself is not used -- and well-known features of Rousseau's account of this concept or certain themes and concerns connected with it. The tendency to speak of an affinity or an analogy is instructive here in that it signals the rather tenuous nature of some of the connections that are made. Not surprisingly, this problem becomes most evident in Part II, which deals with the so-called 'pre-history' of the general will and does not, therefore, concern cases where there is any reflective use of the term. This part consists of two essays, one by Daniel J. Kapust comparing Rousseau's negative attitude to oratory to Cicero's views on its social and political significance, and one by Andrew R. Murphy comparing the content of a speech by the New England Puritan John Winthrop with Rousseau's account of the role of religion in creating (or undermining) the social unity and the spirit of self-sacrifice required by the idea of the general will.

In Kapust's essay, the justification of this attempt to compare Rousseau's and Cicero's views on oratory is in large part based on the role of amour-propre -- a central topic in recent Rousseau research -- in explaining Rousseau's hostility to eloquence and by the way in which Cicero provides reasons for thinking that eloquence can in fact be connected with virtue of a social or political kind. The problem here has less to do with the plausibility of the connections drawn than with the failure to explain the precise nature of the relationship between amour-propre and the general will. This relationship appears to have something to do with the particularity of the former in contrast to the generality of the latter, but this is not to say anything informative about the concept of the general will itself. In the case of Murphy's essay, Calvin is identified as a possible common source of the understanding of the role of religion in fostering social unity, and Winthrop's speech is put forward as a statement of how Christianity can perform this role despite Rousseau's rejection of the idea that it could do so. Yet there is little reason to think that Rousseau would have regarded Puritan Christianity as able to foster anything more than the will of a group of people within a society that is general in relation to the wills of its members but particular in relation to the general will of society as a whole, given that it depends on a particular interpretation of Christ's teachings. By contrast, the kind of civil religion that Rousseau himself has in mind may be thought to concern only some very general principles as opposed to specific doctrines. Thus the essay does not even acknowledge the existence of a problem identified by Rousseau concerning how a will that can be regarded as general in one respect can be regarded as particular in another one. There is, moreover, an aspect of Winthrop's speech that is arguably incompatible with Rousseau's views on the conditions of a social unity that is genuinely expressive of the general will, namely, his acceptance of a hierarchy determined by wealth which generates differing degrees of social power that in turn produce relations of dependence. Winthrop asserts that there are ethical obligations connected with the condition of mutual dependence in which the members of the community, whether they be rich or poor, find themselves. But there is no recognition of the fact that different degrees of social power based on wealth can generate the kind of asymmetrical relation of dependence, and thus the potential for domination, that for Rousseau was a central problem to which his theory of the general will aimed to provide a solution. The loose connection between the content of both essays and the concept of the general will makes it difficult to see in what sense we have a pre-history of the general will at all. Certainly, no attempt is made to show that either Cicero's or Winthrop's writings in some way provided the basis for the future development of this concept or that they played a causal role in its emergence as a key concept of modern political discourse.

The tendency to establish and describe connections that are ultimately not especially deep, at least not as they are presented, with the aim of situating an essay within a narrative concerning the development of the concept of the general will that may also help extend our understanding of Rousseau's theory of the general will can already be witnessed in Part I. In the essay by Williams on Spinoza already mentioned, for example, the argument is made that Spinoza's use of the term 'common mind', when properly analysed, bears some affinities with Rousseau's idea of a general will despite some obvious differences, especially with respect to their views on freedom of the will in the case of individuals. Spinoza is nevertheless said to acknowledge the existence or possibility of a societal will, to which he refers using the term 'will of all', and which Williams describes as "a collective choice -- and, in this case, a wise choice of society over anarchy" (138). Anyone aware of Rousseau's distinction between the general will and "the will of all" might be puzzled by the lack of any explanation as to why Spinoza's use of a phrase identical to one used by Rousseau to refer to a will that is not the general will should nevertheless to be regarded as signifying a general will in the same sense of the term. Although "the choice of society over anarchy" admittedly suggests a common interest, it itself raises a problem in that even for Hobbes there is a common will in this sense, and there does not, therefore, appear to be a distinctive enough connection between Spinoza's "will of all" and Rousseau's idea of the general will. This creates the overall impression of a very loose narrative concerning the history of the concept of the general will. At the same time, essential distinctions made in Rousseau's own account are ignored, whereas it is precisely by examining such distinctions that we might expect our understanding of the meaning that this concept has for him, and thereby what is distinctive about his contribution to the history of the concept of the general will, to be enriched and extended. If the response to this criticism were to point out that Part III is dedicated to Rousseau's account of the general will and thus to furthering our understanding of these points, it would simply invite the question as to the purpose of the constant attempts to relate Rousseau's, or issues allegedly related to it, to what earlier philosophers, political theorists or religious thinkers have had to say about the general will or about a concept that can in some way be viewed as its equivalent.

Part III comprises four essays, two based on previously published material, those by Williams and by Tracy B. Strong. An attentive reader might be surprised to find the second, by Richard Boyd, claiming that Rousseau's idea of the general will concerns a procedural view of justice without considering possible alternative interpretations, immediately after Williams's essay, in which it is argued at some length, and plausibly enough, that Rousseau's general will is based on an objective notion of justice which cannot, therefore, be identified with any type of procedure but must instead be thought to provide a norm in the light of which the legitimacy of the outcomes of any deliberative procedure can be judged. Disagreement about the nature of Rousseau's idea of the general will is, of course, not in itself a problem. One would nevertheless expect all of the essays dedicated to this topic to argue for a particular interpretation of it in the face of other possible interpretations. However, only the essay by Williams clearly does so despite the apparent aim of this part to provide more clarity about what Rousseau means by the general will and what he contributes to the history of this concept.

Boyd's essay nevertheless opens the way for discussion of an important topic concerning the nature of the general will, namely, the extent of its generality. The essay seeks to identify and describe a tension that allegedly exists between justice and compassion. The relation between compassion (or pity), which is a theme discussed in Rousseau's Second Discourse and in Émile but not in the Social Contract, and the general will is left rather unclear. The point seems to be that compassion is incompatible with the general will because it is necessarily particular and partial. However, the fact that compassion is always directed towards particulars (i.e. suffering individuals or particular groups of them) does not entail that it is also partial, for a generalized sense of compassion, in the sense of one that came into operation in all relevant cases and to the same degree, is at least conceivable. Boyd also switches without any apparent justification from talking about a tension between justice and compassion to one between justice and beneficence, as if compassion and beneficence were self-evidently the same thing. The tension he identifies between the general nature of the will of a particular political community and the particularity of this will vis-à-vis other such "general" wills nevertheless brings into play the problem of how a will that can be regarded as general in one respect can be regarded as particular in another one.

In the next essay, by Sankar Muthu, the related, but essentially different, topic of the tension between the general will of a political community and the universal will of humanity together with its implications for Rousseau's views on international relations are discussed in detail and with insight. Even if this essay does not extend our understanding of the idea of general will as such, it certainly extends our understanding of some of the major implications of Rousseau's theory of the general will, and in this way it situates itself comfortably within an account of the history of the concept of the general will even though it makes less of an obvious effort to do so than many of the other essays.

Part IV is concerned with looking at the reception of Rousseau's account of the general will. It begins with another essay by Riley based on previously published material, this time on Kant's theory of the general will. This is followed by Shannon C. Stimson's insightful discussion of how certain aspects of Adam Smith's review of the Second Discourse, and some of the phrases found in the Second Discourse itself, made their way into his The Theory of Moral Sentiments as part of a response to Rousseau's diagnosis of the ills of commercial society and an attempt to provide an alternative solution to them to the one offered by Rousseau's theory of the general will. To set out Smith's alternative to Rousseau's general will is not, however, to say much about the general will itself. Thus, once again, what is meant to be the central concept of the book appears to play only a relatively minor role in it. Moreover, the chronology is rather strange given that the texts by Kant which Riley mentions were published decades after The Theory of Moral Sentiments.

There are then two essays dealing with the reception of Rousseau's theory of the general will in nineteenth-century French liberalism: Bryan Garsten's on Benjamin Constant and Michael Locke McLendon's on Tocqueville. Part of the way in which they seek to engage with the idea of the general will is by examining how Constant and Tocqueville challenge the emphasis on generality in politics associated with this idea. In this respect, both take up a theme already introduced in Part I in Sharon R. Krause's essay seeking to locate Montesquieu among the critics of the general will rather than among its proponents before Rousseau because of the way in which he was tolerant of, and even endorsed, particularism in politics. The final essay by Christopher Brooke discusses John Rawls's sympathetic account of Rousseau's theory of the general will, although here too much of the discussion concerns issues whose relevance to the concept of the general will itself is assumed rather than explained in sufficient detail.

This sudden transition from nineteenth-century French liberalism to Rawls fits a narrative that locates the concept of the general will, both as an object of criticism and as a concept that is partially endorsed, within the broader history of liberalism. In Rawls's case there is also the connection with Kant's appropriation of the concept discussed by Riley; and even earlier, in the essay by Strong, we encounter a Rousseau to Rawls via Kant narrative. Yet this trajectory gives the book as a whole a rather parochial appearance in that a different tradition from the classical liberal one is mentioned only in passing even though its importance is noted in the introduction. This is the German idealist tradition associated with such philosophers as Fichte and Hegel. The concept of a "common will" plays a central role in Fichte's legal and political philosophy of the 1790s, and although he does not use the term 'general will', this common will clearly represents a version of Rousseau's general will. In the essay by Strong, moreover, the theme of commonness as a defining feature of the general will is emphasized, and it would therefore be inconsistent to exclude Fichte from a history of the concept of the general will simply on the grounds of this terminological difference. Hegel offers not only a critique of the general will in his attempt to explain the French Revolutionary Terror but also accords the "universal" (the relevant German word could also be translated as 'general') will a significant place in his theory of a modern form of ethical life (Sittlichkeit), and he contrasts this universality or generality of the will with the particularity of the will. Fichte's and Hegel's engagement with the question of the nature and validity of the general will and their exploration of some of its implications in turn opens the way for an account of the role of this concept in the writings of a later figure such as Marx. The mere fact that The General Will does not contain a single essay dedicated to one or both of these philosophers and offers no justification for their exclusion means that the "history" of the concept of the general will that it offers must be regarded as a decidedly incomplete one.