The Geometry of Desert

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Shelly Kagan, The Geometry of Desert, Oxford University Press, 2012, 656pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199895595.

Reviewed by Saul Smilansky, University of Haifa


Perhaps no man is an island but, according to Shelly Kagan, the graph of what a person deserves is a mountain. This can be easy to picture: take the vertical Y axis to represent "how good or bad a given state of affairs is from the point of view of desert" (p. 48), and the horizontal X axis to represent the "reward magnitude", understood in terms of well-being. There is a degree of well-being that a person deserves on account of her virtue and vice. When she is situated at that point, matters will be morally adequate from the point of view of desert; this will be a point on the graph. This point is where she deserves to be; it is, as Kagan puts it, what she absolutely deserves. The more deserving a person is, the further to the east the point representing her desert will be located. Next, think of this point as a peak, sitting atop a triangle with an open base (or an inverted V), and we have our mountain.

The reason that the graph takes the shape of a mountain is that, while the person's absolute level of desert is a point, or peak, she can in fact be worse or better off than this peak. Kagan calls this the person's current desert, which may be lower or higher than her absolute desert. If the person is worse off than she absolutely deserves, then she is located below the peak, to its left, on the western slope of the mountain. The farther down she is from the peak, the more distant she currently is from where she deserves to be. Similarly, if her current level of well-being exceeds what she deserves, she will be on the eastern slope, to the right and down from the peak. So far so good. But where, for example, is the baseline for locating the individual mountains, before desert begins to operate? Should the two slopes of the mountain be symmetrical? How steep should these slopes be? Should they be curved, and if so, which way? Will there be bell motion here (i.e., will the mountains shift, clockwise or counterclockwise)? Kagan presents an admirably systematic, rigorous, careful, and thorough investigation of such questions.

But to what purpose? Kagan distinguishes between the familiar questions of the desert literature (which he does not address) and some unfamiliar ones. Some of the big, often-discussed questions include the following. Does desert depend upon free will and moral responsibility, and is there enough of these to ground a genuine notion of desert? What is the basis for desert, namely the way in which people become more deserving (e.g., is it through their intentions, or efforts, or the results of their actions or perhaps their potential)? What should the rewards of desert be? Does desert matter in itself, intrinsically? Should moral desert be calculated and rewarded on the basis of particular expressions of virtue and vice, or should we care mostly about people getting what they deserve when we look at their lives as a whole? Although Kagan does not investigate these familiar questions, he assumes for the sake of his discussion that there is sufficient metaphysical and ethical grounding for desert. He believes that the deserving deserve to be rewarded (or penalized) in terms of their well-being, thinks that it is intrinsically a good thing if people get what they deserve. Kagan also holds a consequentialist understanding of desert whereby (other things being equal) we ought to try to maximize the goodness of states of affairs in terms of desert; he is uncommitted on the basis for desert and on time frames for judging what a person deserves.

Kagan seeks to go further, into unexplored territory, which he then wishes to map. He claims that by using the new graphing notation he proposes, we will discover a host of unfamiliar philosophical questions of great importance, which we can then explore:

For aside from the relatively familiar questions about desert, there are, I believe, a number of equally important, but unfamiliar questions that remain to be addressed. These are questions that we have not yet noted. Indeed, for the most part they are questions that have largely been neglected in the philosophical literature. Yet our understanding of the nature of desert remains significantly incomplete so long as these other questions -- equally important, but less familiar -- are unexplored. So they will be our concern in the work that follows. (p. 19)

The mapping project is not incidental to the journey into the unfamiliar territory of new questions: the graphs are where the journey is to be made and the discoveries found. Kagan also claims that engaging with the graphs themselves will be the most useful way of investigating these new questions. In the process, it becomes apparent just how complex a notion desert is.

The thought that geometry might be a good model for ethics has a long tradition. Spinoza famously sought to build his Ethics as a system of axioms and deductions. Some of Derek Parfit's most important work (such as the "Mere Addition Paradox" leading to the "Repugnant Conclusion"), and of those doing philosophy "in the style of" Parfit, has been presented through graphs that generally resemble Kagan's. Yet I know of no other ethicist who takes graphs as seriously or who sees them as the center of his endeavor.

How, then, are we to evaluate Kagan's ambitious project? Two issues seem central to me here: philosophical fruitfulness in terms of uncovering new questions and advances in dealing with philosophical questions (whether old or new). The most exciting prospect is that Kagan's thorough investigation of desert through graphs might uncover new philosophical questions. While we are very impressed when a philosopher offers a significant and genuinely novel insight into a perennial old problem, the excitement of philosophy comes out perhaps most clearly when a totally new question or puzzle is uncovered. Philosophy is at its best when it enters new territory and makes us realize that there is a difficulty where none was ever recognized. Yet in this respect I found The Geometry of Desert disappointing. Despite its truly awe-inspiring rigor and inventiveness, few wholly new questions are revealed in it.

It is not only that, contrary to the expectation Kagan creates, the "unfamiliar" questions that are taken up are as a rule of lesser consequence than the older, familiar grand questions of the desert literature. I simply did not find the book's discussion, including the detailed work with the graphs, to be very helpful in uncovering new questions, at least as far as the better-travelled territory of noncomparative desert, in which we consider what individuals in themselves deserve, is concerned (I will come back to comparative desert below).

For example, Kagan discusses at length the question of where to position the individual mountains before virtue and vice begin to operate; that is, roughly, what people deserve before they start earning their desert. This matters because many would want to say that people "deserve" to be happy, even if their balance of virtue and vice is "neutral"; or, differently put, that they "deserve" to be happy unless they are particularly vicious. In stating it, we may already see that this question is not so unfamiliar. Ben Vilhauer has argued in recent years for a notion of desert according to which people deserve merely on account of being persons, irrespective of what they do. Personhood, then, generates desert. Vilhauer defends this through a broadly Kantian view on respect for persons. He argues that there are some desert claims that are not based on actions, including our claims to deserve to be respected, to our rights, and not to be used as a mere means to the ends of others. I am not convinced; as I have argued before, I think that it is better to think here of a non-desert moral baseline (depending upon context, the baseline could be something like personhood, or a baseline stipulating that everyone should be considered innocent until proven guilty). Desert comes into play through a requirement for desert-based justification for diverging from the (non-desert) baseline. If there can be no such justification (for example, if desert depends upon praiseworthy or blameworthy action, but we are hard determinists), then it is not the case that desert ceases to matter and we can do as we wish. On the contrary, the absence of desert becomes morally crucial, in an important sense no divergence can be just, and we are then "stuck" at the baseline for desert. Among the merits of this view is that it retains the significance of desert, yet maintains the conceptual link between desert and agency (or its absence). However one decides on this matter, the question has already arisen in the past.

The question has also come up in the religious context: if we have all, at birth, inherited great sins, then perhaps we start off at a level of well-being that is in negative territory and then need to advance ourselves, through our virtue, to a level where we might begin to deserve positive well-being. (According to common Christian doctrine, we cannot do so by ourselves but require grace -- and, of course, on some views, no individual can influence his future well-being at all.)

It is similar with the other major questions Kagan discusses by way of his graphs: whether it is worse for people to get less than for them to get more than they deserve; whether it matters more that those at the edges, i.e., the very virtuous or very vicious, get what they deserve than it does that the boringly normal do so; or whether the better you are, the more it matters that you get what you deserve. These questions are in fact not surprising, and quite familiar. Thus, I do not find Kagan's graphic method particularly fruitful in generating new philosophical questions on desert.

An exception is Kagan's discussion of comparative desert. Since in comparative desert we are typically interested not in a deep or detailed analysis of an individual's deserts but rather in a comparison of individuals at a lower moral resolution, we might expect graphs to be able to play a particularly useful role here. And this part of the book is indeed the most rewarding. Kagan's view of comparative desert is firmly grounded in noncomparative desert: "comparative desert is perfectly satisfied when (and only when) the offence against noncomparative desert is the same for all relevant individuals" (p. 390). Building upon this idea, he goes on to analyze and discuss various questions relating to comparative desert. Of particular interest is his discussion of moral priority from the perspective of desert. When we can benefit only one of two people, whom should we benefit? Should we prefer the person who is most virtuous or the one for whom we can do more (i.e., the one we can bring closer to his peak)? Such issues have ready parallels in discussions of utility versus priority in other contexts, but it is interesting to see how things unfold with desert. Kagan also discusses at length how to measure comparative desert in multi-person contexts. Finally, his discussion of comparative desert culminates in ingenious thought experiments that are intended to flesh out our intuitions on the relevant questions, such as whether a world with people who differ in their proximity to where they deserve to be becomes better or worse, from the perspective of desert, if more people are added. This resembles the discussion of when inequality increases or decreases, in Larry Temkin's Inequality.

Graphs are a technique, rather than content; taking Kagan's book seriously requires that we devote some time to reflecting on this matter. Consider art: some great artists are primarily appreciated for the content expressed in their art, irrespective (insofar as we can make the distinction) of whether they were unusually innovative in their technique. Rembrandt's portraits come to mind as a preeminent example here. In other cases, it is the invention or development of a technique (say, linear perspective) that is the focus of the advance, even though the originators might not have had anything of great depth or originality to say about the human condition. Philosophical fruitfulness in uncovering previously unrecognized questions might be analogous to the first instance. Methodological progress, which then helps us to better understand and sometimes solve recognized philosophical questions, might be equated with the second. But here, again, I have doubts about Kagan's ambitious claims for the graphic approach to ethics. One reason is immediate: in this book, the graphs do not seem to be very efficacious. Time and again Kagan remains uncommitted, content to show how different approaches to a given question would be represented by differences in the graphs, and says that his own intuitions are unclear on the given question. As he concludes:

But even with regard to the kinds of questions that I have explored . . . I have largely contented myself with sketching alternative views, sometimes noting which ones strike me as most plausible. To be sure, in several cases I have in fact argued for a particular position. But even in those cases where I have done this, I have typically left the details unsettled. (pp. 627-628)

Yet if someone as adept as Kagan in the use of graphs repeatedly remains uncommitted, or only weakly committed, on the very questions the graphs are supposed to help us make progress on, then this raises serious doubts as to how philosophically useful the graphing notation really is,. Moreover, it is often unclear how much the graphs really contribute to establishing Kagan's considered intuitions (and, ipso facto, those of other users). It is one thing to lay out the graphic expression of your intuition and quite another to be swayed in your intuitions by this mapping.

On reflection, this may not be surprising: why expect that reflection on matters such as the steepness or curvature of an individual's desert graphs would challenge our moral intuitions on the comparative importance of giving the morally virtuous or vicious their due? Why expect that a topic so much discussed as retributivism would be clarified by reflecting on the question of which of the four planes created by the X and Y axes (in Kagan's graph described at the start) will be occupied by the vicious?

I myself like graphs, and often use them to help explain my thoughts. It can be useful to be able to draw differences rather than merely talk about them. We should be grateful to Kagan for helping to facilitate this through his notation. But one would have hoped that the proposed complex notation had been more helpful in offering solutions, or at least in generating new arguments and insights. Imagine, for instance, that the introduction of mathematical notation had allowed contending scientists to state their differences numerically, but had never helped to determine which theories were correct and which mistaken! It could reasonably be replied that this analogy sets the bar too high. Yet I suggest that the burden remains on Kagan to show in what way, beyond mere ease of exposition, his ambitious claims for the merits of the graphic method are warranted.

For the problem is also that the use of graphs is not harmless. There are considerations in the other direction, various drawbacks to pursuing this method in a context such as desert. One is that it risks diverting our attention. Kagan spends much of his time trying to decide on the adequate pictorial representation of various concerns and positions, and the reader often feels that this comes at the expense of an engagement with broader ethical concerns and with the depth of the moral questions themselves, so that little philosophical argumentation in fact emerges.

Consider Kagan's rejection of the use of ratios in the context of comparative desert. I think it instructive that Kagan, for largely graph-related reasons, rejects the use of ratios. Two of his main objections concern the difficulty of calculating negative desert numbers and the problem presented by zero desert. The first difficulty seems to be solvable through counting negative numbers as positive ones. As for the zero, this does not seem to me to be an adequate reason to jettison the use of ratios (just as we would not reject long division because of the difficulty of dividing by zero). By contrast, the idea of the ratio is not only manifestly useful in many contexts (think about percentages, for example), but also ethically important: ratios are central to the idea of proportionality, a mainstay of theories of self-defense, warfare, punishment, taxation, political representation, and so on. Giving up the centrality of ratios in thinking about desert is therefore a very high price to pay. Kagan, however, without considering this broader ethical background, rejects the use of the idea of the ratio for what seem to be limited, technical reasons.

To take up one further example, Kagan says: "One can have so much -- whether happiness (for the virtuous) or suffering (for the vicious) -- that more is bad. At a certain point, enough is enough" (p. 225). Note that we are speaking here only of noncomparative desert, so the constraint on increasing happiness for a given virtuous individual is not a concern over some ensuing gap with others. But should morality object to the unlimited increase of individual happiness for the (non-saintly) highly virtuous? Utilitarians, of course, would say No and welcome the prospect (other things being equal). Although I am not much of a utilitarian, I, too, am nevertheless very skeptical about Kagan's equation of virtue with vice here. I was looking forward to the development of a discussion on the issue in this context, but Kagan wraps things up quickly and does not really confront the challenge. One suspects that this is a result of the pull of the graphs themselves (since Kagan plausibly holds that there are limits to the harm the vicious deserve, this "invites" a similar stance on the virtuous, thereby maintaining the symmetry of the mountains of desert).

A different difficulty that can quickly illustrate the price we may pay for an emphasis on graphs is that a given level of well-being may appear to be just as adequate morally, from the perspective of desert, in the case of a person who is both highly virtuous and highly vicious and in the case of a second person who has much lower levels of both virtue and vice. If we were to discuss such cases in words, we would not fail to note the moral difference between them. (We might in fact quickly arrive at a skeptical attitude toward the very thought that there could be a combined sum of a person's goodness. If a person has been particularly cruel to someone else, for instance, this might never be able to be completely compensated for, even if the first person makes a particular effort to be generous to the second, let alone to other people. That, I take it, is a major part of the point of the need to be forgiven by the other.) But in Kagan's relevant graph, which aggregates virtue and vice (Kagan is an aggregationist), no such moral differences will appear as long as the levels of virtue and vice cancel each other out to the same degree. Both persons -- the person who is sometimes seriously vicious and on other occasions unusually virtuous and the "bland" person who is little of either -- will share the same point or peak. This is not to deny the possibility that one could devise a more complex graph that took this matter into account. My point here is merely to point out how graphs pull us towards oversimplification and mask important issues.

Another drawback of the proposed method is that it naturally limits us in what we can take into account. A narrative account of a person's desert is in principle almost unlimited: it can go on and on, listing the particularities of circumstance and the complexity of factors that go into establishing his desert on a given occasion or more broadly. But the challenges of two-dimensional graphing are inherently constraining in the context of desert. So while graphing can be helpful, it also quickly begins to have a flattening effect, forming a procrustean bed for the understanding of a complex value such as desert.

Working graphically also tends to hide moral vagueness. The recognition of vagueness pulls against the geometrical urge, and while it would not be impossible to graph vagueness (think about areas rather than lines), it is perhaps no wonder that Kagan focuses almost exclusively on points and lines. Yet one could argue that people typically deserve reactions that lie somewhere more or less within a range rather than something as exact as a point on a graph. When we see desert geometrically, then, we risk allowing ourselves to be misled about the nature of both the phenomenology and the moral truth of desert.

Finally, moral concerns can sometimes just not be mapped in a Kagan-style graph. Consider deserved punishment. After the Second World War, many Germans who had been involved in the Holocaust or in war crimes completely eluded punishment, often with the complicity of the allies, who were eager to leave history behind, particularly with the advent of the Cold War. But some such people were punished by the authorities in the newly formed democratic West Germany. Except for those at the very top, however, this was typically done in a way that was clearly inadequate, with highly culpable persons often receiving very lenient sentences. Was it better that they got at least a little bit of what they deserved? From the geometrical perspective that is obviously so, because the distance to their desert-peak is thereby narrowed (the punished person's location on the western slope of his desert mountain has risen). But the value of this does not seem obvious to me: neither from the point of view of morality nor from that of the victims is it at all obvious that matters are better. The appearance of justice is often worse than its manifest absence. It can be argued that giving people very little of what they deserve, thereby in a sense "closing the account", is sometimes morally worse than giving them none.

Kagan could respond that, qua desert, matters are indeed improved, and that the issues I raise do not affect his concern with the maximization of desert, all else being equal. But I take my point to be a challenge from the desert perspective itself: arguably, concern for desert should generate the worry posed by this sort of example. From the perspective of desert itself (it seems to me), it might sometimes be better to have no actual desert rather than a mockery of desert. This is not just for the sake of justice and social appearance but also because of the way that having been leniently punished can make living with oneself easier: getting a little of what one deserves, in the form of being punished leniently, may improve one's well-being.

So should such people not get punished at all? There is a complexity and a dilemma here at the heart of desert. Kagan's graph notation hides such issues, rather than laying them bare. (Part of the difficulty here might relate to the deontological-retributive character of the concern in my examples, as compared to Kagan's consequentialist understanding of desert, but I do not think that this is all there is to the problem.) Kagan starts off by claiming that the geometrical method will help to unravel the unrecognized complexity of the notion of desert, but, ironically, we see that the graphic turn can itself be detrimental in various ways to the recognition of complexity.

The Geometry of Desert is a model of analytic rigor, clarity, and thoroughness. An enormous amount of thought, care, and effort went into writing this book, which explores the possibilities for the design and use of graphs in numerous settings and with considerable originality and inventiveness. Yet I am unconvinced that it delivers on its promise of uncovering significant, genuinely novel philosophical questions. Nor does it contribute much to understanding the philosophical questions it tackles. The book does, however, provide a helpful notation for visualizing many familiar moral concerns and disagreements in a graphic way. It also provides tools for mapping and comparing the desert of individuals (in a very general and abstract way). In general though, it is unclear how much the graphic method illuminates and how much its drawbacks encourage ethical oversimplification. That said, in this book Kagan has done more than any other philosopher, and indeed perhaps more than all previous philosophers combined, to raise the salience of this question.