The German Stranger: Leo Strauss and National Socialism

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William H. F. Altman, The German Stranger: Leo Strauss and National Socialism, Lexington Books, 2010, 618pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739147375.

Reviewed by Benjamin Aldes Wurgaft, New School for Social Research


According to William H.F. Altman, the German-Jewish historian of political philosophy Leo Strauss was “the secret theoretician of National Socialism” and almost a Nazi. Readers familiar with the “Strauss Wars” fought between Strauss’s critics and defenders during the past decade may not be shocked: since 9/11 Strauss has been accused of being liberalism’s worst foe and of being the secret (and thirty years posthumous) architect behind George W. Bush’s foreign policy in Iraq and Afghanistan, so why not a secret Nazi philosopher as well? However, readers of Altman’s The German Stranger: Leo Strauss and National Socialism will find far more than the simple charge that Strauss, who left Germany to pursue studies in France and England just before Hitler’s rise to power, might have joined the Nazi Party if his Jewish heritage hadn’t made that impossible. In the process of pressing his case Altman surveys Strauss’s debts to German philosophers both Jewish (Moses Mendelssohn, Hermann Cohen, Franz Rosenzweig) and non- (Immanuel Kant, G.W.F. Hegel, Friedrich Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger), provides an iconoclastic portrayal of Strauss -- usually portrayed as a defender of Platonism -- as an anti-Platonist, and casts Strauss as the titular “German stranger” who attempted to seduce American youths to an illiberal philosophy after his 1938 arrival on American shores.

One does not need to be a Nazi to flirt with fascism. On May 19, 1933, Strauss (then pursuing his research in Paris) wrote to his friend and fellow Heidegger student, Karl Löwith, and discussed the dilemma facing German Jews, months after the NSDAP had taken power. While Strauss did say that he saw “no acceptable possibility of living under the swastika,” he also said “there is no reason to crawl to the cross, neither to the cross of liberalism, as long as somewhere in the world there is a glimmer of the spark of the Roman thought.” Since this letter’s publication in Heinrich Meier’s 2000 edition of Strauss’s Gesammelte Schriften, and the letter’s 2009 appearance in English translation in the journal Constellations, the revelation of Strauss’s sympathy for fascism — “Roman thought” — has been a cause for scandal in some circles and a degree of “I-told-you-so” for critics who have always read Strauss as advocating rule by philosopher-kings. But Altman bases his charge of Nazism not on this letter with its suggestions of support for (Mussolini’s?) fascism, but rather on a lengthy discussion of Strauss’s philosophical and political influences that led him to a radical atheism and a Nietzsche-inspired support for the will-to-power manifest in National Socialism. Altman’s Strauss actually found National Socialism attractive precisely because it opposed Judaism and liberalism at once.

Altman’s prosecutorial case begins with Strauss’s 1922 doctoral dissertation on the philosopher F.H. Jacobi, which Altman identifies as the real origin of Strauss’s famous “exoteric writing” thesis — Strauss’s biographers often date it to the late 1930s, just before Strauss published his 1941 statement of the thesis in “Persecution and the Art of Writing.” While Strauss wrote his dissertation on Jacobi’s knowledge-theory, for Altman the real importance of Strauss’s choice of subject derives from Jacobi’s part in the Pantheismusstreit in which Jacobi, a confessing Christian, accused the dramatist Gotthold Lessing of being a closet “pantheist” or Spinozist. Strauss came to suspect that Jacobi himself had been concealing his own closet Spinozism all along; religion had been a cover, necessary to conceal a private atheism derived from philosophical reason. Recent works on Strauss have emphasized the way Strauss’s readings in al-Farabi and Maimonides influenced his “exoteric writing” thesis, and Altman’s discussion of Strauss’s discovery of deception in Jacobi provides us with a welcome broadening of our inquiry.

This is far more welcome than the other lesson Altman tries to draw from Strauss’s apprentice work on Jacobi: according to Altman, Jacobi’s counter-Enlightenment tradition contained within it a tendency towards “self-deification” (Selbstvergottung) utterly antithetical to the Jewish tradition. That tendency then led, Altman insists, to a desire to eliminate Judaism’s philosophical influence, and “it is not difficult to detect the specific but necessarily well-concealed tendency in German Philosophy that leads to the Holocaust.” (65) Altman is far from the first author to try to see the shape of the Holocaust in the tea leaves of eighteenth- and nineteenth-century German thought, but the appearance of his book in 2010, when such reductive and teleological readings have fallen out of favor, is alarming. Teleological accounts of history can also produce weirdly anachronistic claims, such as when Altman allows himself to call Moses Mendelssohn, one of Jacobi’s intellectual adversaries, “the Holocaust’s first and paradigmatic victim,” (75) perhaps in an unconscious parody of Walter Benjamin’s suggestion, in the Theses on the Philosophy of History, that not even the dead are safe from fascism.

Once Altman has aligned the young Strauss with this broad if implausible tendency in German philosophy, he turns to Strauss’s early Zionist essays, mostly produced between 1922 and 1925. Strauss “converted” (his term) to Zionism at age 17, and he would later write on the tangled subject of German Zionist politics with the same sharp insight that characterized his readings of philosophy both ancient and modern. Strauss was a “political” as opposed to a “cultural” Zionist. He preferred practical political actions leading to the acquisition of a Jewish state as opposed to the promotion of Jewish cultural activities, possibly in the Diaspora, and this despite the fact that Strauss was deeply influenced by the work of Franz Rosenzweig, not only a great philosopher but also an important promoter of Jewish cultural activities during the Weimar years. Strauss would dedicate his first published book, the 1930 Spinoza’s Critique of Religion, to Rosenzweig’s memory.

The political Zionist Strauss opposed liberalism partly on the grounds that it was cultural Zionism’s bedfellow; for proponents of cultural Zionism it was possible to believe that liberal states would allow Jews and their culture to flourish and that liberalism would outlast the rise of nationalist politics. Strauss was attuned to the radical nature of Weimar politics and had no faith that the liberal order would stand. Yet Strauss was also fascinated by the variety of Jewish Orthodoxy practiced and promoted by the rabbi Isaac Breuer, who objected to political Zionism on the grounds that it hoped to supplant divine law with the secular law of the state. Though Strauss ultimately opposed Breuer, he acknowledged the attractions of a life according to God’s law rather than a life according to that of man — though as an atheist he would opt for the latter, effectively accepting Spinoza’s view of Judaism as a political affair. Strauss’s encounter with Breuer’s orthodoxy, like his far more prolonged encounter with Rosenzweig’s, would influence Spinoza’s Critique of Religion, which asked whether or not Spinoza had decisively answered the “question” of religion.

For Altman, however, the links between Strauss’s Zionism and his later Jewish writings (for Strauss wrote on Maimonides more than on almost any other single figure, Plato included) are far less enticing than the familiarity Strauss displayed, in his Zionist writings, with the anti-Semitic literature of his own, and earlier, periods. Altman’s Strauss effectively accepts the anti-Semitic Orientalist Paul de Lagarde’s “Jewification” (Verjudung­) hypothesis, according to which the flowering of liberalism in German culture was really a “Jewish phenomenon” — that liberalism itself was Jewish. Thus no resolution to the Jewish Problem could ever be achieved on liberal grounds. But the real importance of Strauss’s atheist political Zionism, on Altman’s view, lay in its proximity to nihilism. Altman’s Strauss opposed liberalism’s procedural rationalism, longed for the replacement of liberal society (Gesellschaft) with community (Gemeinschaft), and hoped German Zionists would endorse “a power principle” to push their goals forward. His readings in Nietzsche prepared him to accept Martin Heidegger as “the only great thinker in our time,” as Strauss indeed called him. Strauss studied briefly with Heidegger and famously told Rosenzweig that Heidegger’s lectures made Max Weber look “like an orphan child.”

But while it is easy for Altman to make the case that Heidegger’s thought attracted Strauss, particularly given its emphasis on decision, extremity, and leadership — and given Heidegger’s injunction that one should read the source-texts of classical philosophy afresh — it is somewhat harder to follow Altman’s reasoning when he encourages his reader to simultaneously consider Strauss’s failure to cultivate any ideological position that would have secured “effective inoculation from the bacillus of National Socialism,” as if such failure was tantamount to a desire for “infection.” (147) Altman seems to imply that Strauss was eager to accept Heidegger as an influence because he and Heidegger were brothers in nihilism, the same nihilism that made it possible for Heidegger to openly embrace National Socialism while Strauss could only, as in his letter to Löwith, long for “the Roman thought” from the relative safety of exile.

For Altman there is something essentially pagan-fascist in both Strauss’s Zionism and Heidegger’s Nazism. Despite the sensationalist nature of Altman’s “Nazi Strauss” claim, its substance is really philosophical rather than political: it rests on the idea that, for Strauss, National Socialism had an inner content of a sort: he embraced his friend Jacob Klein’s suggestion that National Socialism was “Judaism without God, i.e., a true contradiction in terms.” Klein did not mean, of course, that National Socialism was somehow a perverted form of Judaism itself — rather, it was an atheist political ideology capable of the greatest self-contradictions in the pursuit of power, and it denied the dualisms familiar both to Platonists and to readers of the Hebrew Bible. Judaism without God becomes nihilism. While it is true that Strauss delivered a strange lecture to the general faculty seminar of the New School for Social Research in 1941, “German Nihilism,” in which he criticized Hitler but praised the earlier “German Nihilists” whose work the Nazis had corrupted, Altman’s claim that Strauss was a philosophical friend of Nazism rests on the idea that there was nothing in his thought but atheist nihilism, that he was so enamored of Nietzsche that there was never any room in his thought for Plato.

But the very real correlations between Strauss and Heidegger, like the correlations between Strauss and Schmitt, fall short of conclusive proof that Strauss secretly approved of his teacher’s political choice. Altman, who must certainly have read Hume, seems to think that the appearance of correlations allows us to deduce a deeper causal link — a view the skeptical Scot abjured. Peter Eli Gordon’s recent Continental Divide, on Heidegger’s 1929 Davos disputation with the neo-Kantian Ernst Cassirer has emphasized the problems of historical misinterpretation that emerge when Heidegger’s early philosophical work is read only in light of his having joined the NSDAP in 1933. Simply put, the philosophical content of Heidegger and Cassirer’s dispute over how to read Kant drops out of the picture when one thinks only of Cassirer as a German Jew whose teacher Hermann Cohen had dreamt of a German-Jewish symbiosis and of Heidegger as a soon-to-be-Nazi. Referencing Gordon’s work, Altman nevertheless ignores its implications, allowing him to characterize Heidegger’s bellicosity during the dispute with Cassirer as “an endorsement of the First [World] War and therefore the Second.” (165) Strauss’s claim that Heidegger defeated Cassirer — his own doctoral supervisor — seems, to Altman, like an affirmation not only of Heidegger’s philosophy but of his politics as well. The most regrettable effect of Altman’s transfixed gaze — his inability to take his eye off of Heidegger’s political mistakes — is that Strauss’s far more interesting responses to Heideggerian existentialism remain lost in the periphery. And Altman clearly has the philosophical attunement to explore them.

Whether one agrees with Altman’s arguments against Strauss or not, this book provides pleasures familiar to any reader of Strauss’s own works: it is lovely to follow a mind enchanted by reading. Altman’s book may be prosecutorial in spirit and form, but in order to build his case against Strauss he reads closely, examining the “exoteric writing” thesis of “Persecution and the Art of Writing” as well as Strauss’s mature defense of natural right against liberalism, and delves into many of the classical sources upon which Strauss commented — as a Latin teacher, Altman has expertise many Strauss scholars lack. Even a reader (like this one) disinclined to agree with Altman’s vision of philosophy as deeply divided along easily ascertained political lines will be impressed by the depth and breadth of Altman’s scholarship and the passion with which he argues his points.

Unfortunately his prosecutorial impulse ultimately seems to overcome the interpretive, and this is where Altman’s book may fail even those few readers willing to embrace his “Nazi Strauss” thesis. Towards the end of his book Altman (no exoteric writer!) places his cards on the table in a series of autobiographical statements, such as “I am a believer and a philosopher, a Platonist and a Christian, a Liberal Democrat and a Jew.” (391) It gradually emerges that it is here, to Altman’s own credo, that we have always been moving. The destructive project of attacking Strauss has been a means to the end of promoting Altman’s own personal philosophy, precisely because Strauss seems (to Altman) to be against God and Plato as well as against liberalism, whether in Germany or in his adoptive homeland of the United States. Once read in this light, The German Stranger’s presentation of a truly radical but necessarily clandestine Strauss makes more sense: this is a work of self-understanding reached through combat, whose Schmittian resonances Altman can only concede.

Whether one finds Altman’s case convincing or not, the real question to ask is why it matters so much to write about Strauss at this historical moment. Altman provides a partial answer in the autobiographical sections of the book: while he learned from Strauss’s students decades before writing this volume, he only became a Strauss scholar himself in the highly politicized context of the 2000s. Many of the works he references were written after 2003, when a spate of newspaper and magazine articles (sometimes by very reputable journalists) suggested that Strauss had planted a cabal of his students in Washington, part of a long-term plan to influence the government of the United States: these were the neo-conservatives responsible for much of George W. Bush’s foreign policy. Recent Strauss scholarship has, thankfully, been mostly free of such conspiracy theories but the attractions of writing on Strauss clearly include his work’s relevance to a range of post-9/11 concerns, including the religious critique of secularism, the “clash of civilizations” thesis, and the question of American imperialism. One could suddenly accomplish serious political work by writing about Strauss — a tempting call for many scholars but, potentially, a siren’s song.