The German Tradition in Aesthetics

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Hammermeister, Kai, The German Tradition in Aesthetics, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 278pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521785545.

Reviewed by Paul Guyer, University of Pennsylvania


This book is a brief history of German aesthetics from Baumgarten and Mendelssohn in the mid-eighteenth century to Heidegger, Gadamer, and Adorno in the mid-twentieth century--although, as the author notes, it should be called a history of Germanic aesthetics, since it includes Søren Kierkegaard, a Dane, György Lukács, a Hungarian who wrote in German, and Herbert Marcuse, who did the work discussed here in the U.S. (pp. x-xi). The author defends the restriction of his work to this tradition because, he claims, the “German aesthetic tradition is resistant to outside influences to an unusually high degree” -- a claim that I would deny in the case of all of the eighteenth- and nineteenth-century writers he discusses, and for at least some of the twentieth-century ones -- and because “philosophers outside this discourse respond to German concepts without themselves having a significant influence in shaping the tradition” (p. x) -- again, I think, a dubious claim in at least some cases.

Hammermeister states that he will organize his discussion of the individual figures around three issues: “the philosopher’s ontological discussion of art, the…epistemic role attributed to art and beauty, and…the practical function the writer locates in artworks” (p. xiv). He fulfills this promise more in some cases than in others. The thesis of the work is “that paradigmatic positions in aesthetic philosophy were established during the period of German idealism and romanticism, that these paradigmatic positions were subsequently challenged by writers in the nineteenth century” -- though he has to twist himself into a pretzel to make Schopenhauer’s challenge subsequent to Hegel’s paradigm (pp. 111-12) -- “and that in the twentieth century all the positions were renewed precisely in the order in which they first emerged” (p. xii). I found the author’s discussions of the figures he treats less systematic than these two claims would suggest and did not always find a clear statement of the paradigms the authors in the period from Kant to Hegel were supposed to have established. His statement of the historical thesis of the work is particularly misleading because his discussion of Adorno, the last major figure from the twentieth century treated, aligns him with Schelling and describes him as emphatically rejecting the Hegelian view that art (or anything else) contributes to the emergence of an unified, integrative view of reality.

Hammermeister begins with a brief discussion of Baumgarten and Mendelssohn, maintaining that neither broke significantly from the framework of Leibniz and Wolff, although Baumgarten emphasized the cognitive value of perception and Mendelssohn recognized the value of the artistic expression of emotion in a way that his predecessors had not. I think this account underestimates the significance of Baumgarten’s conversion of the Wolffian definition of pleasure as the “sensitive cognition of perfection” into the “perfection of sensitive cognition,” which really makes Baumgarten’s account of the potential pleasures in the use of our perceptual powers independent from the Leibnizian metaphysics of perfection; and I think he also underestimates the significance of Baumgarten’s conception of aesthetic experience as “clear but confused” -- or as some translate “fused” -- perception, which had a tremendous influence on conceptions of the syntax of aesthetic objects from the “aesthetic ideas” of Kant through Hegel to Suzanne Langer and Nelson Goodman. I believe that Hammermeister also underestimates the power of Mendelssohn’s complex model of the sources of pleasure in aesthetic experience. But the focus of Hammermeister’s first chapter is on Kant. He presents Kant as “subjectivizing” aesthetics by focusing on the experience rather than the work of art, as advocating the “autonomy of art,” and as being unable to reconnect aesthetics and morality once he has sundered them. As the contrast between the “subjective” and the “objective” is a central theme of the work, with the progress of Schelling and Hegel over Kant and that of Heidegger and Gadamer over Ernst Cassirer being alleged to consist in the move from “subjectivist” to “objectivist” conceptions of the aesthetic, I think that both the charge that Kant “subjectivized” aesthetics and the contrast itself need a far more careful examination than Hammermeister gives them; he seems to accept uncritically Gadamer’s view that Kant is the source of this sin. His account also confuses Kant’s conception of the autonomy of aesthetic judgment -- the idea that such judgment must be made entirely on the basis of one’s own feeling even though it aims at intersubjective validity -- with the idea, a century later, of the autonomy of art. I don’t believe that Kant ever entertained the later idea of “art for art’s sake”; rather, he confidently held that where art does not have moral significance it quickly becomes distasteful to us.

Hammermeister next presents Schiller as introducing a moral function for art -- holding out to us an ideal of a world that is better than the one we currently occupy but attainable -- which also allows “the beautiful to transcend the subjective sphere” (p. 55). He begins his chapter by stating that Schiller introduces an “anthropological and historical foundation” rather than “transcendental grounding of beauty” (p. 43), but ends up claiming that Schiller is unable “to successfully fuse the historical and the formal aspect of his aesthetic theory” (p. 69). He then argues that Schelling develops a more successful account of how art allows the individual (subjective) consciousness to achieve identity with an absolute (objective) object, through the history of the development of art (which, as he notes, Schelling borrows wholesale from A.W. Schlegel), which represents “the harmony of conscious and unconscious activities” (p. 70). But Schelling’s account (at least through the 1800 System of Transcendental Idealism) overemphasizes the significance of art as the only genuine “organon” (as Schelling says) of truth, and it is up to Hegel to provide an account of the genuine cognitive and moral, objective significance of art, which however places art in a proper position of both historical and theoretical subservience to philosophy. Hegel’s key insight, according to Hammermeister, is that while art is genuinely objective, it “can only retain its claim to truth if it is not considered as containing the truth of totality, but that of the multiplicity of the real” (p. 104). I do not think that Hammermeister recognizes how dependent Schelling’s conception of art as bridging the unconscious and the conscious is on Kant’s conception of genius, and thus how problematic the basic distinction between “subjectivist” and “objectivist” conceptions of art really is; and while he recognizes that Hegel’s “death of art” thesis puts into question whether art actually has enduring objective significance on Hegel’s account, I found his discussion of this threat (pp. 101-5) quite inconclusive.

In Part II, “Challenging the Paradigms,” Hammermeister discusses Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche. On his account, Schopenhauer reverts to a “subjectivist” standpoint even more extreme than Kant’s, and with his emphasis on art as a tool for the individual alleviation of suffering gives up all effort to connect the aesthetic to a communal morality. Kierkegaard, with his radical distinction in Either/Or between “aesthetic” and “ethical” attitudes, likewise gives up on any serious effort to connect the aesthetic and the ethical. Nietzsche, conversely, especially in his works of the 1880s, “aestheticizes” philosophy itself, although without providing precise definitions of his central categories of taste, beauty, and “aesthetics as physiology” (p. 149). Although Hammermeister does not make explicit any connections between Nietzsche on the one hand and the paradigms of Schelling and Hegel on the other, on his account Nietzsche could be seen as parodying Schelling’s early claim for the superiority of art over philosophy and rejecting Hegel’s position that art is essentially a stepping-stone on the way to philosophy. Instead, Nietzsche’s cardinal sin is to reduce all philosophy to a matter of personal taste -- the ultimate in “subjectivism.”

In Part III, “Renewing the Paradigms,” Hammermeister presents Cassirer as a neo-Kantian, Lukács as a neo-Schillerian, and both Heidegger (with his disciple Gadamer) as well as Adorno as neo-Schellingians -- there is apparently no room for a revival of Hegel in the twentieth century. He criticizes Cassirer for reviving, in his own theory of symbolic forms, Kant’s alleged separation of art from both science and morality, rather than allowing that Cassirer may also be exploring commonalities among these human enterprises by analyzing them all as forms of symbolic expression. Lukács “echoes” Schiller in seeing art as a “transhistorical aesthetic norm” for a better human life but makes no attempt to “deduce” this norm nor offers any clear way to “square this notion with a thoroughly materialist aesthetics” (p. 165). Heidegger “insists with Schelling on art as a Wahrheitsgeschehen…an occasion when truth becomes conspicuous,” and, while not insisting with Schelling that art offers “the only access to truth”, he nevertheless places it “above the propositional correctness of science, and, hence, some versions of philosophy” (p. 173). Hammermeister does not question Heidegger’s assumption that there is some deep “truth” about “being” -- as opposed to many truths about many beings and our experiences of them -- for art to reveal, nor does he question Heidegger’s Luddite hostility to modern science and technology -- as if the solution to the ills of the twentieth (or twenty-first) century were to turn the calendar back to some premodern page rather than to learn how to use politics and diplomacy to control arms-races and instead put the potential of modern science and technology to work for the betterment of ever larger numbers of individual human beings. On the connection between art and morality, Hammermeister credits Heidegger with continuing “that idealist tradition that had always regarded art as a communal event” and seeing that art not only “breaks down the barriers between men” but is also “one of man’s primary activities on which all social life is based” (p. 184). Hammermeister treads remarkably lightly on Heidegger’s Nazism, claiming that there is nothing about Heidegger’s praise for the community-building function of art that “makes this concept specific for a National Socialist aesthetics,” but that “nevertheless, the fact that Heidegger drops the political references in his writings on art in the in the 1950s and 1960s could be understood as a result of his disappointment with the National Socialists” (p. 185). Poor Heidegger -- disappointed by the “National Socialists”! I have to say that the use of this term rather than the blunt “Nazis,” thereby suggesting that the Nazis were just some sort of ordinary political party, makes me shudder. Following the discussion of Heidegger, Gadamer is given a few pages, in which he is described as taking “up those interpretations of art that consider it as a form of play” (p. 190) and recognizing that “art provides order in a disorderly, chaotic world” (p. 192). When Schiller (or for that matter Lukács) characterize art as holding out to us an image of how a better world might be, that is apparently “subjectivist” and utopian; but when Gadamer says that art does provide order in a chaotic world, there is apparently no need for criticism.

Finally, Hammermeister’s account of Adorno is fraught with tension. On the one hand, he claims that for Adorno, like Schelling but opposed to Kant, “not only does art offer cognition, but it also offers such cognition where the philosophical concept falls short” (p. 205). On the other hand, all that art can do with its alleged cognition is to keep alive “the hope for a better life in a better world” by saying “’No’ to the present” (p. 201), and “art can only be political by completely refusing to participate in all matters social -- it must negate communication” (p. 207). Something has to give here -- although I am prepared to think that these tensions are Adorno’s, not Hammermeister’s -- for if art can offer some cognition, even only cognition that there must be some way in which the world could be better than it is now, then, one would think, it must have some way of communicating this cognition, while if art must negate communication, then one might think that it must also negate cognition. Of course, maybe there’s some deep sense of “cognition” independent of all possibility of communication that I’m failing to understand here, just as I fail to understand some deep sense of “being” independent of all particular beings.

Hammermeister clearly feels that there is something profoundly wrong with “subjectivist” and “ahistorical” aesthetic theories and something profoundly right with “objectivist” and “historical” theories. But he does not offer any general account of what the aims and tasks of aesthetic theory should be which would allow us to see why this must be so. And while he is explicit in his criticism of those whom he regards as “subjectivists,” he allows the most implausible claims of his “objectivists” to pass without any critical examination at all. The historiography of the whole work, as I have already suggested, is very much based on Gadamer’s view that Kant sent modern aesthetics down the wrong path by his “subjectivizing” emphasis on aesthetic experience rather than aesthetic objects. But Hammermeister never asks whether there is really anything we need to say about aesthetic objects that we can’t say by talking about what is distinctive in our experience of such objects, including the social, political, and historical conditions and significance of such experience, or, conversely, whether there is anything we have to say about aesthetic experience that we can’t say by talking about what is distinctive about the objects of such experience, including their social, political, and historical functions. In other words, Hammermeister never subjects to critical scrutiny the dichotomy on which his book is based. This is a serious limitation on the philosophical value of his work. The book provides brief introductions to the works of its subjects, which could certainly be of some use to new students of aesthetics if they are guided by well-seasoned teachers, but it does not attain the high level of the scholarship on the history of aesthetics that has been produced by philosophers in the last several decades, let alone advance that scholarship.