The Gestation of German Biology: Philosophy and Physiology from Stahl to Schelling

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John H. Zammito, The Gestation of German Biology: Philosophy and Physiology from Stahl to Schelling, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 523pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226520797.

Reviewed by Lenny Moss, University of Exeter


In his 2004 review of both Frederick Beiser's German Idealism: The Struggle Against Subjectivism 1781-1801, and Robert Richards' The Romantic Conception of Life and Philosophy in the Age of Goethe,[1] John H. Zammito defines the conversation that shapes the aims and point of departure of his recent book and in relation to which he offers some criteria for assessing its merits. The conversation in question is about critically advancing a new appreciation for the status of German Idealism and Romanticism in relation to contemporary naturalism but even more specifically it's about overthrowing old prejudices against Naturphilosophie and defending its relevance to empirical life science. In the background, but not deep in the background, is the continuation of an on-going demolition of Timothy Lenoir's[2] Kantian interpretation of some of the same history, but more on this later.

As the subtitle of his book would suggest, the new volume provides a valuable reconstruction of the events of the 18th century that culminate in the celebrated efflorescence of ideas in its final decade, but Zammito gives us good reason to believe that his aim goes well beyond a merely academic history. In the 2004 review, Zammito insists that "Historicism is not antiquarianism; intellectual history is always as presentist as it is historicist. . . Always, the encounter is mediated by our present" (p436). In the current volume Zammito carries over and amplifies this sentiment.

But my interest is driven by concerns for our philosophy of biology and naturalism more generally. Accordingly, this study is devoted to the historicist project of constructing the progress of the eighteenth century that opens the way for a 'special science' in a presentist sense'. (p13)

I am going to argue that, despite much of value, it is exactly in terms of this ambitious philosophical desideratum that the work falls short and for reasons pertaining, I will suggest, to the commitments and limitation of Zammito's adherence to this conversation.

The 18th century pathway toward the emergence of a biological science provides a dizzying array of twists and turns and ideological antagonisms that less historically oriented philosophical readers may find delightfully bewildering, such as the realization that "mechanists" and "materialists" could have been mortal enemies. The richness of Zammito's institutional and biographical detail, however, often appears to come at the cost of reflective clarity with respect to the history of ideas, but it's the latter that I will attempt to adumbrate.

Zammito's reconstruction of 18th century pre-biology begins with the late 17th/early 18th century German chemist, physician and philosopher Georg Ernst Stahl. Enthusiasm for the capacity of mechanistic analysis to account for living processes at the beginning of the 18th century issued practices of "iatrophysics" into medically oriented research . Stahl, while a leading chemist of the times, held the "rational" capacity of living tissue to sustain functional order and resist decay to constitute a prima facie basis for rejecting any purely physicalist medicine. If, as the legacy of 17th century mechanism held, matter is fundamentally inert, then it is not capable of actively sustaining, repairing and reproducing functional order. Stahl posited the existence of an inherent soul (anima) as an immaterial and yet empirically observable complement to the material body that would provide the source of "rational" order that the material body lacked. Stahl's "animism" would thus be an early, albeit immaterial, anticipation of the ascription of life forces and drives to come.

A crucial turn in the pathway toward physiology as an autonomous science was an epistemic and methodological appropriation of the late work of Newton by the eminent Dutch medical physiologist (and botanist) Herman Boerhaave and especially by his Swiss student Albrecht von Haller. In his 1692 De Natura Acidorum, concerning alchemy, chemistry and the theory of matter, Newton began to explore the possible role of short-range attractive forces. If, contrary to the received Cartesian view of the inherent inertness of matter, the sources of actions and activities could be located in the intrinsic forces of physical systems then a new pathway for the purely material investigation of functional systems would become possible. With the high epistemic bona fides of Newton himself, a practice Zammito calls "Newtonian experimentalism" began to claim philosophical legitimacy on the basis of empirical methods and inference without having to lay claim to either mathematical formalisms or grand theory. To what extent more systematic interpretations and conjectures could also claim warrant would eventually become a point of controversy.

A practice of Newtonian experimentalism led to von Haller's signature achievement, the identification, and distinguishing, of the "forces" of irritability and sensibility. Irritability, the contraction of muscle fiber, became the exemplary case of an experimentally elucidated organic mechanism; sensibility, by contrast, which pertained to the action of nerves in triggering contraction of muscle, was more complicated as it also entailed sentient experience and thus the putative existence of a soul. Irritability emerged as the paradigm case of a vital function that could be grasped in purely materialist terms. Overcoming the residual dualism of Haller's force of sensibility, however, would also raise concerns about atheistic "Epicurean" materialism. Haller, like his mentor Boerhaave, was a dedicated Christian and opponent of any such runaway materialism. Haller's placement as director of the Göttingen Academy did establish Göttingen as the foremost center in Europe for the study of physiology as an autonomous research enterprise.

Theological and/or moral trepidations did not constrain Boerhaave's second most accomplished student, Julien Offray de La Mettrie, from pressing the possibilities for a thoroughgoing materialism. Materialism becomes vital when it lays claim to the ability to subsume all forms of living phenomena, including the mental and/or "spiritual" under its monistic auspices. Resisting the anti-Spinozist (and arguably anti-Semitic) constraints upon pursing a vital materialist agenda, La Mettrie, along with French colleagues Pierre-Louis Moreau de Maupertuis, Georges-Louis Leclerc de Buffon, and Denis Diderot were protagonists of what has been called the "Radical Enlightenment."[3] French vital materialism, in Zammito's account, plays a crucial intermediary role in the pathway toward German Naturphilosophie.

Maupertuis led the attack on deistic, mechanistic, preformationism in favor of a new epigenesis that draws upon the seminal fluids of both parents but requires some new force capable of bringing the right particles together in just the right way. Buffon famously offered the idea of an internal mold as a means for advancing this theory. Diderot made the case for extending the interpretative ambit of experimentalism beyond strict empirical observation. In exploring the applicability of the same family of mechanisms in an infinity of different ways, nature appears to adhere to a unity of method, a universal principle, or "world soul". The dualism of irritability and sensibility can be overcome if sensibility is pervasive in nature albeit only dormant in inorganic matter. Buffon, the most important natural philosopher of the group, an intellectual polymath not trained in medicine, led the anti-Linnaean move away from purely descriptive biological systematization and toward "natural history" as instead an explanatory enterprise, involving processes of generation and transformation, common descent and species "degeneration." Buffon famously introduced the idea that species identity is based upon generative/reproductive capacity and not merely descriptive verisimilitude. The progressive emergence of physiology as an autonomous science can thus be seen to draw upon both a shearing off from clinical practice on the one side and the transformation of natural history from a purely descriptive endeavor to an explanatory natural philosophy on the other.

The impetus toward a renewal of epigenesis theory born in French vital materialism, in turn, was imported to and advanced in Germany by Casper Friedrich Wolff. Zammito understands Wolff as likewise laying claim to the epistemic authority of experimental Newtonianism on behalf of his dissent from the preformationism of his former mentor von Haller. Wolff claimed to be the first to offer a properly explanatory account of embryology based upon empirical observation and inference. An adequate account for Wolff must involve a substance and a force acting upon said substance. Wolff's basic construct, drawing principally upon the study of plants, holds the substance to be that of a fluid capable of solidification into parts under the influence of a formative force. In animals, as in plants, a "nutritive fluid" is acted upon by an essential force, or "vis essentialis," that elicits the appropriate solidifications, albeit in the case of animals the process is much slower than it is in plants.

The "historical turn" that becomes identified with 19th century thinking, Zammito tells us, had its roots in 18th century responses prompted by four problems: 1) the problem of the plane and orbital direction of the planets in our solar system, 2) the problem of geological change, 3) the problem of the origins of life and its differentiation and 4) the problem of generation (development). In Germany, it was Kant himself who led the drive from a descriptive to an explanatory/generative history of nature (coinciding with the commencement of his teaching physical geography). Gottfried Herder's subsequent more radical program on behalf of an all-pervasive "hylomorphic" continuity from the inorganic all the way to man became the source of a fateful wedge between Kant and his former student. The turn towards generation, transformation and continuities led to questions about boundaries -- boundaries between the animate and inanimate, animals and plants, and animals and man.

Interestingly, to the extent that 18th century Europeans had direct access to apes it was mostly with juveniles who fared better in and after transport. Owing to as yet unappreciated processes of developmental neoteny in human evolution, the lack of robust anatomical differences between humans and juvenile chimps suggested for some that human attributes such as speech and the upright gait could not be accounted for in terms of anatomical differences. La Mettrie and Rousseau even contended that orangutangs were human and could be taught to speak and, as Zammito tells us, Kant held that bipedalism was not natural to humans but rather due to the intervention of rationality. Johann Blumenbach, along with Buffon and Haller (and Kant), rejected claims to continuity between humans and apes, not on anatomical grounds, but on the basis of the human mind.

If the boundary between apes and humans was subject to equivocations it would not be surprising that there would also be debate about the unity of humans as a species, resulting in discourses about race and the origins of what has been referred to as "scientific racism." Those who championed the idea of multiple human origins were called "polygenists" and those who held to a common origin for all humans "monogenists". The latter would position finding itself with the burden of accounting for human diversification. Blumenbach, who is generally credited with introducing the five-fold racial taxonomy of humans, rejected skin color as a reliable basis for drawing distinction because he felt that skin tone was prone to reversibility and was variable along a gradient. He chose instead to base his distinctions on cranial shape and "facial angle." He had initially suggested four groupings of humans but eventually added "Malay" as a fifth. Blumenbach himself never ascribed to the idea of objective boundaries between racial groups and in fact considered the absence of clear boundaries to be the best evidence in support of monogeny. He nonetheless embraced white-skinned Europeans as the first and most attractive race albeit with some circumspection about ethnic bias. In his Handbuch der Naturgeschichte of 1779 Blumenbach expressed his commitment to classifying taxa on the basis of the "total habitus of the organism" and also rejected the idea of any smooth chain of intermediate forms between species. Blumenbach placed humans in a separate genus and identified the main distinguishing characteristic as that of the loss of instincts and organs of self-defense "in short all those [vulnerabilities] man is rescued from by reason" (p210), and "explicitly connected the absence of instincts in man with his ability to penetrate all habitats on earth and establish ubiquitous settlement."

Blumenbach introduced his concept of the "Bildungstrieb" in the 1782 version of his Handbuch, which became the central concept of his subsequent work. It also brings us to a fork in the road whereby I will argue that Zammito forfeited the opportunity to make good on the 'presentist' side of his aspirations as well as losing some of the credibility of his text by way of a markedly injudicious reading of Kant. Beyond some further elucidation of the juncture to which I have referred, I will confine the remainder of my summary of Zammito's text to just an abbreviated synopsis of its treatment of Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer, Goethe and Schelling, both because of the limits of remaining space, but also because it is less evident what these discussions contribute to that already provided by Beiser and Richards. I will then go on to say some things about the direction and presentist possibilities of the path not taken.

Beginning with his defense of the unity of the human race (monogeny) and attempt to provide an explanatory account of the generation of human diversity (and its limits), Kant proposed a theory involving the idea of an original stock of generative potential, albeit finite potential, consisting of a set of Keime und Anlagen (germs and proclivities), that, under the influence of environmental pressure could become adaptively specialized albeit at the cost of diminishing further adaptive capacity. In so doing, for example, he could arguably account for why peoples who had become adapted to a Nordic climate and then eventually migrated into equatorial regions of the Americas could obtain sun-adaptive darkened pigmentation but not to the same extent as Africans for whom equatorial adaption was a primary and not secondary specialization. Kant held that while the resources of human understanding would not be able to account for the coming to be of this original stock of adaptive potential (and would have to be assumed as a reflective and not constitutive judgment), that its workings could become susceptible of mechanistic explanation. Kant believed he found much affinity between his stock of Keime und Anlagen model and Blumenbach's theory of the Bildungstrieb (which was limited to the organic world) and indeed Blumenbach modified subsequent renditions of his Handbuch to further realize this affinity.

In his 1982 book The Strategy of Life,[4] Lenoir laid claim to the idea that out of the Kant-Blumenbach correspondence there arose a "teleomechanist" research program embodying a Kantian regulative vs constitutive distinction, that could be clearly demarcated from all forms of Romantic Naturphilosophie, and whose uptake can be seen at root in the great advances of 19th century German biology including the identification of germ layers in embryonic development, the identification of the human ova, the primacy of the cell and the advancement of cell theory and cellular based studies of pathology. Beginning with Ken Caneva's scathing 1990 review, a minor cottage industry ("The Conversation" to which I referred above) arose oriented toward denying the influence of Kant and, with no less partisan fervor, championing the scientific merits and accomplishments of Naturphilosophie instead. Zammito's subsequent reconstructions tend to follow suit.

For Zammito, Kielmeyer becomes the pivotal thinker in transitioning to the fully historically oriented perspective of the 19th century. More in tune with Herder than with Kant, Kielmeyer was interested in pursuing a theory of life that was linked to, albeit not reducible to, the inorganic. Organic processes entailed a force that was supplemental to those of physics and chemistry but not such as to exclude them. Where the inorganic world involved cycles, the biological world constituted irreversible spirals. In addition to forces of irritability and sensibility Kielmeyer added forces of reproduction, propulsion and secretion. He attempted to advance the understanding of the explanatory systematicity of life forms by assuming an overall conservation of forces but with differing ratios that reflect the place of a life-form in a hierarchy. The preponderance of irritability, for example, would be inversely proportional to the place of species in the hierarchy of life forms. Kielmeyer hoped to link the forces involved in the transformations of the earth with that of the transformations of organisms and speculated that magnetism may come to be central to this. However, he soon disparaged being able to make good on these aspirations inasmuch as he felt that there was too little secure knowledge on all fronts to be able to do so.

For better or worse, Zammito chose to distance many of his 18th century protagonists from Kant's influence but not so in his very suggestive account of Goethe whereby it's all about explicitly transgressing Kant's proscribed limits in his Critique of Judgment. If our aesthetic judgment enables us to conjure, for example, by way of intuitive averaging and normalizing, an idealized facial form that we instinctively use as a measure of beauty then why not credit our aesthetic insight with the ability to conjure an archetype that affords cognitive benefits as well? Surely Kant delivers to us the power of a normativizing holism when it comes to our aesthetic perceptions of beauty in nature. Goethe it would seem merely takes upon himself the task of imaginatively unpacking what the aesthetic intuition of the associated "goodness" of the organism presupposes. "Morphology" is constituted then by way of an aesthetic-imaginative free-play that provides cognition with a holistic insight it couldn't provide for itself by purely discursive means. To grasp a morphology then is to achieve an intellectual intuition into the space of normative developmental possibilities. The archetype morphology, as Dalia Nassar suggests, "is not a thing or completed product, but productivity" (p293).

For Schelling finally, it's all about productivity but productivity writ large, nature as such as pure productivity (natura naturans as opposed to natura naturata), a view that can only be approached speculatively and yet must also be able to hold itself accountable to empirical study. Schelling pursues a synthesis of Buffon, Kant, Blumenbach and Kielmeyer. Nature as such is as a stock of Keime und Anlagen in that it is not random or dispersed but is itself a coherent unity. As a Bildungstrieb it gives rise, epigenetically, to discrete parts contingently responsive to context. As pure productivity nature must also contain a polarity, a mediating countervailing force that results in new species as incomplete and contingent expressions of its formative powers, which in turn may become loci of subsequent bursts of productive novelty. Schelling resisted the idea of empirically based laws of species transformism as it is nature as such that continues to be the agency of production. "Nature is but one product that lives in all products" (p313).

Unless Zammito's present tops out circa 1830, it is difficult to see how his strongly avowed presentism shows itself in this study. Bluntly stated, there is no indication of any biological science of the past 100 years (plus) being present in Zammito's sights. Physiology itself, has long since (about 30 years) lost its status as an autonomous division within the research university and has largely returned to the clinical curriculum under the auspices of different organ physiologies. Nor is it likely that any living reader will have experienced a time when physiology and philosophy were close kin. Beiser, Richards and now Zammito have done well at restoring the status of Naturphilosophie as an enterprise worthy of a place at the table but the continued excommunication of any representations of a "teleomechanist" program surely has more to do with sectarian loyalties than advancing a conversation with presentist ambitions. Even in his most scathing critique (which for many philosophers has been sufficient grounds for ignoring or dismissing Lenoir's work tout court), Caneva acknowledges that

Lotze, Schwann, Bergmann, Leuckart, and Virchow did (more or less) combine teleology with mechanism by taking as the starting point of scientific investigation organisms so contrived that the explanation of their organic functions did not require going beyond normal forces of physics and chemistry, how that organization originally came into being was a question which lay outside science.[5]

Beginning with a critical evaluation of Zammito's treatment of Kant, I will offer some suggestions for how subsequent investigators, with a vision of contemporary problems in the philosophy of biology, could draw upon the legacy of teleomechanism and Naturphilosophie as complementary resources.

Caneva, Richards, and Zammito have all problematized the idea that German physiologists (including Blumenbach) even understood, let alone used, Kant's idea of a regulative use of teleology. From a "presentist" and scientific point of view however the exact interpretation of Kant's distinction may be of less moment than the extent to which Kant's "methodology of teleology" has been pragmatically put to use in practice. Zammito offers a surprisingly tendentious reading of Kant that could only serve to obscure the serviceability of Kant's recommendations. Practically speaking, Kant's recommendation was to bracket the question of the origins of purposive organization, the origins of the stock of Keime und Analgen, and proceed to use mechanistic analysis to account for its actions as far as one can. Zammito, by contrast insists in two places that Kant wants to require reference to a metaphysical account of the ultimate origins of purposeful order, which would be exactly contrary to the methodological intentions of the critical philosophy. On page 234 Zammito exhorts that: "Kant was adamant that the ultimate origin of 'organization' or the formative drive (Bildungstrieb) required a metaphysical, not a physical account" and then on page 237: "Kant's own effort to understand specific organisms under the regulative rubric simply created more problems than it solved, and at the very least made it necessary to resort to the idea of the teleology of nature as whole." In neither case does Zammito provide any warrant for his claims (and what is even odder is that these assertions bear much more resemblance to positions of Naturphilosophie that Zammito has embraced).

From Rudolph's Virchow's 1855 proclamation that all cells only come from preceding cells, through James Rothman's 2013 Nobel Prize for his work on how the differentiated organization of the cell reproduces itself and regulates intracellular trafficking, many of the foremost advances in cellular biology have, for all intents and purposes, followed Kant's heuristic playbook. The heuristics of the stock of Keime und Anlagen model, explicitly or otherwise, have served as productive alternatives to informational reductionisms in investigations of cancer, adaptive phenotypic plasticity, and evolutionary developmental constraints.[6] But the scope of a "stock of Keime und Anlagen" and the applicability of Romantic notions of nature's productivity must be continually reassessed in terms of advances in the sciences and so do the prospects for complementary use of these legacies. The chemical physics of excitable soft condensed matter now offers the opportunity for renewed thinking about the productivity of matter.[7] Combined with neo-Kantian constraints with respect to what we still can't account for, complementary use of Kantian and Romantic heuristics can offer both ethical guidance and theoretical inspiration. Zammito et al., have made their case for the rehabilitation of Naturphilosophie. The time for invidious historicist squabbling is past. Let's go truly "presentist" and start solving some real problems.

[1] Zammito, J. (2004) "Reconstructing German Idealism and Romanticism: Historicism and Presentism." Modern Intellectual History 1: 427-438.

[2] Lenoir, T (1982) The Strategy of Life (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press).

[3] See Israel, J. (2001) Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity, 1650-1750 (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

[4] Lenoir, op.cit.

[5] Caneva, K. L. (1990) "Teleology with Regrets." Annals of Science 47: 291-300 see page 295.

[6] See Moss, L. (2003) What Genes Can't Do (Cambridge MA: The MIT Press).

[7] See Moss, L and Newman, S. (2016) "The Grassblade beyond Newton: Self-Organizing Matter and the Pragmatizing of Kant for Evolutionary-Developmental Biology." Lebenswelt 7: 94-111.