The Golden Cord: A Short Book on the Secular and the Sacred

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Charles Taliaferro, The Golden Cord: A Short Book on the Secular and the Sacred, University of Notre Dame Press, 2013, 206pp., $29.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268042387.

Reviewed by James G. Murphy, Loyola University Chicago


Taliaferro's book could be fairly described as the world viewed from the perspective of the seventeenth-century Cambridge Platonists (Henry More, Ralph Cudworth and others), elegantly updated to take account of contemporary philosophical and cultural challenges to that view. The "sacred" of the title refers to the claim that the world or reality is not merely intelligible but that it has been made so by a loving Creator who offers human beings a blissful life after death, centered on the contemplation of goodness, truth and beauty. The "secular" refers to the view that we live in a brute physical universe, devoid of inherent intelligibility, with neither minds nor persons nor transcendent meaning.

Taliaferro presents an easy-to-read case for the sacred and the transcendent, offering an experience-based outline of the reasons and impulses that lead people to hold to the reality of the divine, at once transcendent and immanent in human experience. It is a light-hearted survey of the field, noting philosophical objections raised by atheists and secular humanists and briefly replying to them. His treatment is indeed brief, but his responses are philosophically well-grounded. Theologians and students of spirituality will find much that is both insightful and easy of access.

It is not uncommon to come across philosophical treatments of proofs for the non-existence of God which, while philosophically sophisticated, give the impression that their authors have little understanding of why Christians (or other monotheists) take God's existence seriously. This is just the book to remedy that defect. In general, the book would make an admirable prolegomenon to future treatments of the arguments for and against God's existence.[1] Atheists are inclined to assume that something like, for instance, the argument from design is what motivates people to be Christian, as if Christian theism were essentially a kind of explanatory theory, partly quasi-scientific, partly philosophical. They will find much here to correct that impression. Taliaferro's is an effective and clear presentation that gives the indispensable context for understanding Christian belief in God.

Chapter 1 outlines the case against the philosophical viability of materialism or of any kind of physicalism that rejects the irreducible reality of the mental, the personal, the intentional or the experiential, notably as presented in the work of Daniel Dennett and Paul Churchland. To say that Taliaferro does not go into great depth on the issue is not to say that his criticisms are misplaced or insignificant. He does not prove that materialism is false, but he shows deftly that its widespread assumption in philosophical quarters is unwarranted.

Appropriately, Taliaferro moves, in chapter 2. to the materialist claim that one is necessarily identical to one's body. He endorses what he calls "integrative dualism", which rejects the claim that there is strict identity of person and body while asserting that persons are necessarily embodied and that there is a "profound interwoven unity" between person and body. However, he does not give the reader much account of how there could be such unity without identity. He does not adopt an Aristotelian form/matter approach to explain this unity; it would have been interesting had he told us a little more about his own view. Nevertheless, he successfully singles out the weaknesses in materialist objections to his view.

When Taliaferro deals with death as the termination of the body's life and considers its implications for the person, he instead evades the metaphysical issue and escapes into value issues:

At the death of someone whom you love deeply, it is difficult to believe that the value or worth of a person has been exhausted or has reached a natural ending. Our concept of being a person at least appears to be that of a man or woman who is capable of unending growth, love, learning, and relationships. (57, emphasis in text)

For Christian believers, the value of a person is as an end in herself or is grounded in her being a child of God. It is not obvious how that could be altered simply by virtue of the particular person coming to an end, at least as far as her being embodied goes. Second, the Christian concept of person (which I am taking here as a stand-in for any concept of person along the lines that interest Taliaferro) is of a finite being and hence not capable of "unending" growth. It seems that he confuses the issue of the ultimate value of the human person with that of the possible immortality of the soul or person.

In Chapter 3 he touches on the importance, for the believer in God, of agent causality. The Christian cannot very well hold that there is no such thing as agent causality or that all causation is mechanical, and at the same time believe that God is active in the world, caring for creation and all persons therein. Belief in God cannot be an isolated belief, on pain of becoming insignificant. Taliaferro's book reflects the rather obvious yet frequently ignored fact that the most important difference between the Christian and the secularist is not so much the existence of God as the nature of human beings. In their teaching, the last two rather academic popes, John Paul II (1978-2005) and Benedict XVI (2005-2013), spent virtually no time arguing for God's existence and nearly all their time presenting the Christian view of the nature of humanity.

Chapter 3 touches indirectly on the risks secularist thinkers (such as Richard Dawkins or Daniel Dennett) face when trying to build a comprehensive Weltanschauung on the basis of the physical sciences.

Chapter 4 deals with religious experience, a theme long neglected by philosophers, which has finally emerged as significant. Taliaferro introduces us to the issues, helpfully drawing attention to the literature on the topic, notably in the work of William Alston, Gary Gutting, William Wainwright and others. He cites the standard (and rather dated) objections to the very idea of there being such a thing as religious experience, and briefly indicates their weaknesses. We have come a long way from the mid-20th century, when much Anglophone philosophy doubted that talk about God, let alone talk about religious experience, could even be meaningful. Even as late as 1990, some theist philosophers felt the need to prove that religious language was meaningful. Taliaferro, quite rightly, never once considers it to be an issue.

Chapters 5 and 6 turn to traditional issues in theodicy. They are complex, and much computer ink has been spilt on them in recent years. As Taliaferro points out, evil is a problem only within a theistic or moral realist worldview. A naturalistic worldview, particularly if it is also deterministic, rules out evil as a problem, essentially because it eliminates it. Taliaferro's position is: "Our apprehension or even perception that evil is a problem can, in some respects, be seen as a golden cord or clue that we are oriented toward some transcendent good" (112). In the current philosophical climate, it is difficult to hold convincingly to moral realism without being some kind of theist. The existence of evil is a problem only for theists, since only within such an approach can it appear as a design flaw. It is not a problem that naturalism or contemporary atheism can recognize or solve.

Taliaferro touches briefly on the standard issues of free will, innocent suffering, and the apparent absence and powerlessness of God. In chapter 6, he looks at various Christian approaches to redemption. While he illuminatingly connects it to issues of forgiveness, perhaps that chapter could have been improved if he had found another "golden cord", something else in human experience that pointed to the need for redemption.

The final two chapters deal with sharing in and experiencing divine life during one's limited human lifetime. Chapter 7 does so with an eye to debates between eternalists and presentists over the nature of time, and shows that the debate presents no real difficulty to theists. The final chapter recapitulates the book's theme: one must live the Christian (or similar monotheist) life, embrace its spiritual and moral practices, and immerse oneself in what Taliaferro calls "the sacred" in intellectual, emotional and spiritual ways, if one is to philosophize as a Christian.

The view that being a committed theist must necessarily cloud one's judgment, or at the very least undermine one's claim to rational objectivity, has been influential and powerful since the Enlightenment. To a remarkable extent, Christian thinkers went along with it, in the hope of attaining a Cartesian-like virtuous epistemic freedom from all presuppositions. That era is passing, since in both analytic and phenomenological philosophical traditions, a change in epistemological fashion has led to greater acceptance of religious experience and greater awareness that atheist and secular humanist points of departure involve just as much substantive theoretical commitment as theistic ones.

Taliaferro's is the kind of work that this change in epistemological fashion has made possible. Its strength in that regard lies in the easy accessibility of the important themes presented: experience, art and literature, and the way in which philosophical positions concerning God's existence or non-existence imply and are grounded in different worldviews. Anselm's, Aquinas's, Hume's and other classical philosophical arguments for and against the existence of God will always be part of the human cultural heritage. But they do not of themselves address the question: why does it matter whether there is a God, or why does it matter that one believe (or disbelieve) in a God? What has it got to do with living a meaningful human life, or with enjoying one's life or finding one's inner peace? Taliaferro's book addresses and answers those questions admirably. I recommend it.

[1] In that respect, it has much in common with John Cottingham's, The Spiritual Dimension (Cambridge 2005).