The Good and the Good Book: Revelation as a Guide to Life

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Samuel Fleischacker, The Good and the Good Book: Revelation as a Guide to Life, Oxford University Press, 2015, 164pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198733072.

Reviewed by Jerome Gellman, Ben-Gurion University of the Negev


In this book, Samuel Fleischacker sets himself the task of justifying what he calls a "modern" person taking a text to be a revelation. Fleischacker argues for accepting a text as revelatory on the grounds of its having a compelling "telic" vision.

Fleischacker ascribes various characteristics to a modern person: A "modern" person has serious concerns about revering an ancient text (p. 7) and believes that neither scientific means nor observations suffice to establish that God exists (p. 15). A modern person belongs to a liberal society (p. 36), has been raised on a strongly individualistic ethos (p. 43), does not think credible that nature has given us an essence (p. 55), and has intuitions that erotic love, art, and knowledge are good. (p. 64) Given the characteristics of a modern person as Fleischacker sees her, Fleischacker's undertaking is impressively formidable. That he succeeds in making a plausible case for his thesis stands as a tribute to the originality and wisdom of this book.

In chapter one, "Truth," Fleischacker proposes that the truth of a religion should refer not to the historical accuracy of its holy books but to the religion providing a trustworthy path for life. (p. 17) Historical accuracy is a "weak peg" on which to hang one's religious commitment. (p. 14) So, for his Judaism, to say that the Hebrew Bible is "true" is to say that we should rely on it as a guide to life. (p. 18) Here, Fleischacker introduces an important distinction between an "expert" and an "authority." The former gives information that most or many others would be able to give were they to devote themselves to the task. An "authority," on the other hand, is a source of knowledge beyond the capacities of ordinary people. Religion recognizes authorities, and to embrace a text as a revelation is to recognize it as an authority.

In chapter two, "Ethics," we get a central distinction of the book between "morality" and "ethics." Morality is based on a conception of good that is prior to the embracing of any religious text. In part, we test a religious text by how well it complies with prior moral intuitions. (p. 28) Fleischacker notes that people agree much of the time on moral issues (p. 32), there being agreement on the general contours of morality, on the norms, although disagreement will arise regarding specifics cases. In fact, Fleischacker prescriptively identifies morality with the norms of modern liberal society, which morality he thinks is a natural development out of earlier moral conceptions. (p. 35)

"Ethics," as different from morality, pertains to whatever makes a life "good overall." This includes not only morality but all other commitments made regarding the ultimate meaning or purpose of life, hence "telic" good. While there is broad moral agreement, people disagree fundamentally about telic good. What "telic views add to morality," writes Fleischacker, "tends to be not so much a distinctive set of norms as a distinctive role for moral norms in the ultimate or overall human good." (p. 41) Telic goodness should be built on a prior understanding of moral goodness and add meaning onto morality. Ethics thus "frames" morality but also will have impact on the way we make our moral decisions. It turns out, for Fleischacker, that the demarcation between morality and ethics is not a sharp one, but the distinction does point to two senses of "good" in our lives -- moral good and ultimate human good. (p. 41) Throughout, Fleischacker sticks with the view that religion frames morality within a telic vision and does not put in place new moral content "except in marginal cases." And, "there will be little difference between the approach of a religious and a secular person to most moral issues." (p. 128)

In chapter 3, "Our Overall Good," Fleischacker argues cogently for the legitimacy of a religious telic view. He dismisses the trendy view that there is no sense in talking about the telic meaning of life. As for what the meaning might be, Fleischacker argues that religious telic visions are on a par with secular ones in their both being non-rational. He does well in showing that a secular telic tends to make metaphysical or dogmatic pronouncements no less than do religious ones. So, for example, to make art the telic good of life we must rely on something like a metaphysical hidden "creative genius" in each of us. To put one's telic trust in political programs, for another example, is a dogma no less than is putting trust in God.

In any case, it is just as legitimate, in Fleischacker's eyes, to declare that God exists as it is to espouse God's nonexistence. When it comes to intuitions about religion, Fleischacker poignantly points out, "Why should our common-sense intuitions in favor of Shakespeare and do-gooding be any more trustworthy than our common-sense intuitions . . . that there must be a God and an afterlife?" (p. 61).

Fleischacker goes on to argue against the adequacy of any secular telic conception. (pp. 54-56) How many of us can really believe that art, or erotic love, or gaining knowledge for its own sake is or are the ultimate meaning of life? Perhaps we can do so at a time of emotional attachment to these things, he writes, but when time goes by and we sober up (and, I might add: when we grow old) this cannot be satisfying to very many.

The telic good that people seek is larger than any of those mentioned candidates, and, according to Fleischacker, is larger than human capacities can fully conceptualize. Without employing some secular dogma, it would be hard to come up with an adequate naturalistic telic good. (p. 61) Fleischacker argues for the ultimate human good being beyond our full understanding, and thus a telic text that faithfully provides an ultimate human good will have to be somewhat obscure.

In chapter four, "Revelation," Fleischacker sets out the requirements that a text should pass to be considered a revelation. The text should be akin more to poetry than prose, accounting for its obscurity; should purport to have a supernatural source, in order to warrant our trust; present us with a path by way of which we can grasp the mysterious good; accord generally with our moral beliefs; and give us a good explanation for why a secular approach to the good does not succeed.

Given these, "We choose," says Fleischacker, "to be guided towards our highest good, when we commit ourselves to a revealed religion." (p. 74) And: "A religious believer is an active follower, not a passive one." (My emphases in both quotes.) Indeed, later on, commenting on his own commitment to traditional Judaism, Fleischacker maintains that "The Torah repeatedly indicates that God values human autonomy." (p. 110). In his own case, Fleischacker chose the telic authority of the Torah because of its providing a plausible path to the solution of the evils of idolatry. (P. 77) The Torah teaches us not to idolize any object of our desires and not to allow them to close in on us. This telic vision of the Torah is to be read out of the whole, not necessarily from each detail within it.

Chapter five, "Ethical Faith," has Fleischacker arguing cleverly, prompted by Kantian thought, that we may posit a factual claim if it is unprovable and necessary for providing meaning in our lives. On these grounds, Fleischacker reasons that believing in God, an afterlife, and the Torah is as reasonable as adopting a secular telic vision with its own unprovable assumptions.

In his sixth chapter, "Receiving Revelation," Fleischacker considers how a revelation is received once acknowledged. His main points are that people choose what to emphasize -- having to align the text with a moral sense, and doing so within a community of believers, to check on one's personal understanding. Fleischacker asserts that for Judaism the process of aligning the Torah with morality began with the Talmudic rabbis and continues to progress today. (p. 103)

In his final chapter, Fleischacker considers implications of his reasoning on "Diversity and Respect" for a plurality of religious and secular world views. By "pluralism" he means having reason to respect traditions other than one's own. (p. 119) It makes sense, for Fleischacker, that God should reveal different aspects of God's will to different peoples. In any case, respect for "other" religions is required in order to be compatible with "liberal moral values." (p. 126) He argues as well that a public space open to a plurality of views -- religious and secular -- is good for religion because it promotes honesty and decency in a religious tradition.

Fleischacker avers that religious people can learn from the secular, too, yet, "There is no getting around the fact that a religious believer, by dint of his or her religious commitments, implicitly rejects the telic views of secular people." (pp. 126-7). Happily, Fleischacker rejects the "everything-is-equally-true" slogan. To endorse one telic aim is simply to reject others.

Fleischacker has given us a new path to accepting a text as a revelation. Notwithstanding, there are three significant points where the book requires modification or expansion. I don't see any of these damaging the main thesis of justification by telos, but they do relate to the details of how the justification goes. These points involve the relationship between pre-religious consensual morality and religion, and also the nature of religious conversion and devotion.

Point one: Fleischacker addresses the relationship between religion and morality, sometimes seeming to be describing what is usual between religions and morality -- so that religions in fact influence morality only "at the margins," with exceptions, such as in jihadist religion (Fleischacker's example). At other times he seems to be prescribing -- so that religions should influence morality only at the margins. Fleischacker seems to grossly underestimate the degree to which standard religions disrupt and deviate from common pre-religion moral agreement. In addition, what is marginal to morality could become far from marginal within a religious practice, pervasively issuing in a form of life seriously divergent from prior moral consensus. If his is a descriptive enterprise, his view might well bear modification. If his is a prescriptive enterprise, then Fleischacker should help us more than he does to understand why we should not object to familiar religions for the degree to which they wander away from pre-religious consensual morality, which he wants to preserve.

Consensual pre-religion morality advocates not encouraging violence and not silencing the abused or subjugated. Consider, though, the classical, far-reaching Christian morality of loving one's enemy and turning the other cheek, together with the doctrine of kenosis, self-emptying and self-abnegation. These are a distinctive set of norms. A non-Christian might argue that as our world goes, these policies unduly encourage immoral patterns of behavior. Unless we reprimand violence promptly we risk encouraging an increase of violence. And, as feminists have argued forcefully, these doctrines unjustly lead to silencing the abused and subjugated, chief among them women and minorities. True enough, these Christian doctrines do not impinge on central moral principles such as do not kill an innocent person or steal from another person. Yet, when put into practice such teachings shift morality and liberal society into a changed direction. Whether marginal to morality or not, in religious terms these doctrines are not marginal, having pervasive influence on behavior and making for forms of life quite at odds with otherwise agreed morality.

Another example. Contemporary Western morality favors individual freedom of choice, to one robust degree or another. Fleischacker endorses this with the caveat that one should be willing to be guided beyond one's own limitations by an authority. Consider, though, that classic Judaism centrally stresses communitarian values that restrict individual freedom far more than does a morality in harmony with contemporary liberalism. Jewish law systematically and pervasively limits individual freedom for the sake of the community ethos in ways strongly inconsistent with civil liberties. An instructive example is that traditional Jewish law systematically and pervasively prohibits a person from acting in ways that might merely create the impression that he or she is committing a religious transgression, even when it is a mistaken impression. So, one must not do what might look transgressive, even when it is not. According to the rabbis, a person's individual freedom must be widely restricted for the greater good of solidifying the community ethos. More so, one must refrain from such actions even in complete privacy, so as to nurture desirable habits.

In general, the communitarian leitmotif of Jewish law dictates minute legislation for community standards of behavior in numerous daily contexts, restricting individual choice far more than would be tolerated otherwise. Once again, my examples leave in place core prior moral axioms, so in that sense might be thought morally marginal. Yet, even morally "marginal" religious demands when put in practice can make a far-reaching change in the moral life of a religious believer. I suggest Fleischacker go further to refine his thoughts -- descriptively and prescriptively -- about the entangled relation between "secular" and various religious moralities.

This leads me to point two: Liberalism highly values human autonomy, and Fleischacker says that Judaism, his own religion, also values human autonomy. Fleischacker moderates autonomy somewhat this by telling us that "we choose to be guided towards our highest good, when we commit ourselves to a revealed religion." (p. 74) A willingness to be guided by an authority, not an expert, involves giving up a degree of self-reliant individual choice. Still, "A religious believer is an active follower, not a passive one." For Fleischacker, a free individual choice must be at work in dedication to a religion. This anchors religion to a basic liberal desideratum.

Now, taken as a descriptive dictum this is undoubtedly true of many religious believers but equally untrue of many others. If taken as a prescriptive assertion, how one should be religious, Fleischacker is not granting enough to recognize the legitimacy of a religious commitment that does not satisfy the liberal requirement of autonomy. Many people adopt a religion or deepen their commitment to one because, for example, they have experienced themselves grasped by God or overcome by Jesus's love for them. A person can be overpowered by a sense of God's presence or by the saving power of Jesus, as happens in vivid religious experiential events. Or a person can be decided for by Buddhism by the strong transformational influence of their trial Buddhist meditative practice that changes their character. They are Buddha-ized. In these cases, phenomenologically, people are not now choosing to practice their religion, or now not choosing to stay with the one they have been practicing by habit. They experience God or their religion as choosing them. They are not deciding for themselves. As the Gospel of John 15 puts it: "You did not choose me. I chose you." In their religious life such people will feel judged, rather than judging.

Now, one might protest that such people are really only choosing to feel they have been chosen, overwhelmed, or self-transformed beyond choice, choosing to believe as if they have no choice in the matter. In reality, such people are making religious choices no less than were they to have made an explicit choice. However, this protest seems to rely on an unproven dogma about human behavior and choice that is not compelling. That is, unless one simply begs the question about God's saving grace and the profound experience of being "grabbed" by God, for example, or, unless one is locked into the supreme valuation of human choice, as was Sartre, for example. It does look like a religion can confound individual choice, either by a supernatural agent or by deep psychological mechanisms out of a person's control. (Take your choice.)

Perhaps, though, Fleischacker is not describing religious experience but advocating that one should follow a religion only by an autonomous individual choice. If that is so, then we have here a value clash between pre-religious and sometime religious morality over the necessity of human choice in religious matters. From a religious point of view personal autonomy need not be as robust as contemporary liberal strictures would have it.

A third issue to raise here is the function of God in theistic religions, such as Judaism, as Fleischacker understands it. In this book, Fleischacker means to limit himself to the telic argument for accepting a revelation, but the reader will find not much about the ongoing activity of God in the life of a religious Jew. Fleischacker leaves the reader wondering whether for him God's relevance begins and ends with God serving as a posit for validating a telic vision.

I am reminded here of Kierkegaard complaining that, "in duty itself I do not come into relation with God," and "God becomes an invisible vanishing point, . . . His power being only in the ethical". (Note: Kierkegaard means by "ethics" roughly what Fleischacker means by "morality.") Kierkegaard is begging for the believer to have a direct relation to God, not solely a mediated one by God being the deus ex machina who once upon a time set ethics into play. If all God does is set ethics into place, Kierkegaard was teaching, then God disappears from the life of the Christian. Such a "deistic" God does not serve the inward religious life. Similarly, we need to be careful to avoid calling on God only to account for our telic vision and then having God disappear, as it were. That would collapse theistic religions into Kantian religion.

I invite Fleischacker to go further than he has to tell us what he takes to be the place of God within the living religion of a Jew, or of other theists. How might God figure in the daily life of a Jewish believer, for him? What is the meaning of prayer? What are we to understand by "divine providence" in Fleischacker's scheme? Does God at times afford a sense of the divine presence? Does the Jew ever have a direct, not only mediated, relationship to God? I invite Fleischacker to continue his project so as to clear up these issues.

Now, none of the above points damages Fleischacker's thesis of the justification of telic visions. All that follows is that an even wider case can be made for his conclusion, allowing for more ways to justify believing in a text to be revealed, on telic grounds. The original contribution of this book to philosophy of religion, and to the justification of religious commitment, stands out unmistakably, beyond my three points.