The Government of Desire: A Genealogy of the Liberal Subject

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Miguel de Beistegui, The Government of Desire: A Genealogy of the Liberal Subject, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 295pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226547374.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Miguel de Beistegui attempts here what Foucault called a "critical ontology of ourselves." His point of departure is examining the way we lead our lives as desiring subjects in the economic, sexual, and "symbolic" realms (the last being the necessarily intersubjective "desire for recognition"). Rather than being a commentary on what Foucault says, this book takes its lead from what he says but pushes it further, finding unexpected connections and new avenues of thought and practice. True to Foucault's methods, Beistegui looks to archival sources such as court transcripts and government documents, as well as to philosophers. He aims to denaturalize desire, to trace the ways we have been led to lead our lives as desiring subjects, and in so doing to allow "resistance" or "refusal" to our being so governed, freeing space for experimentation with other ways of living our lives.

But why should we wish to refuse our lives as desiring subjects? Although the bulk of the book takes aim at the way our desires are fit into various normalizing practices which "govern" us in sometimes hidden and often dubious ways, some of Beistegui's best passages show the relentless dissatisfaction that spurs ever-renewed desire in the economic, sexual, and intersubjective registers. There is a hint of a Schopenhauerian distrust of restless, unfulfillable, desire, but the analyses are practical rather than metaphysical. Beistegui cites the classic critiques of sexual pleasure as only appeasing but never satisfying our desires, but also, in the economic realm, mentions advertising among the mechanisms endlessly inserting psychological dissatisfaction into our lives. He also evokes Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari's notion of the "creation of lack in the midst of production" (82; citing Anti-Oedipus 28-9: the sort of "anti-production" that, in the US context, is seen in spending $700 billion a year on "defense" but leaving many people poor, unfed, unhoused, and lacking medical care). Finally, Judith Butler's work is adduced in support of the claim that every "recognition is misrecognition," thus frustrating any final resolution of the desire for recognition.

The book is a fascinating work of philosophical interest, historical depth, and contemporary relevance. While the bulk of it is easily readable by those with a basic familiarity with Foucault, the Conclusion, in which Beistegui lays out ways in which refusal and experimentation might occur, will require either expertise with Deleuze and Guattari or supplementation with further reading.

As Beistegui explains in his Introduction, "governmentality," or "conduct of conduct" -- how we are led to lead our lives in certain ways and in certain self-understandings that render us predictable and manageable -- is Foucault's term for a form of power that is neither legal prohibition nor disciplinary training but that coexists with them in complex interactions. As "conduct of conduct," governmentality produces new knowledge and new institutions that manage behavior by comparing it to norms, inducing new ways of being: "whereas a law forbids certain acts, without transforming their subject, the norm generates a form of subjectivity" (10). Governmentality comes into its own when it is used in a biopower system that looks to the management of the many factors that shape the outcomes of populations of living things. In dealing with the intertwining of environmental, social, and psychological factors, biopower and its myriad norms form a vastly wider "space" of management and intervention than that of the law and its regulation of subjects of right or discipline and its training of skilled individuals. Hence, to use the contemporary term, "nudging" people rather than commanding them outright allows them to buy in to leading their lives in traceable, legible ways, making the whole system run smoother and less obtrusively, and hence less likely to be critically examined.

Insofar as the demonstration of a certain contingency of our being governed in this or that particular way is a precondition for experimentation with living otherwise, there is, in addition to an "archeological" aspect to the book -- desire is mooted as a "transcendental-historical horizon, against which certain objects become manifest and others disappear, certain experiences become possible and others not" (14) -- a genealogical aspect, showing how preceding generations were led to lead their lives in ways that coalesce to form the conditions for our contemporary lives. However, Beistegui is always careful to show there is no unity to the government of desire, but a sort of contingent multiplicity, an imbrication of heterogeneous discourses, practices, and institutions.

Desire is not a monolithic and univocal phenomenon, but a multifaceted reality, organized according to different configurations or regimes, all of which have a specific history and singular traits, which I will attempt to distinguish but also reveal in their interconnectedness. (8)

Beistegui's analysis of the government of desire is perforce one level above a first-order "hermeneutics and alethurgy of desire" -- those practices that promise, "tell me your desire and I'll tell you who you are" (14). Rather than interpreting the content of desires, Beistegui wants to show "how the Western subject came to recognize him- or herself as subject of desire" (14). He wants to show not the truths that interpretations of desire claim to reveal, but how desire become a "site of veridiction," a place where truths can be told (15).

Beistegui's thesis is that the modern subject of desire is integrated into liberal governmentality at the turn into the nineteenth century (22). The first such integration is the creation of homo economicus, the topic of Part One, looking at the "invention of norms such as interest, utility, competition, efficiency, flexibility, or capital" (22). One of Beistegui's best moves, made with particular clarity, links the economic and the sexual registers in Part Two by showing the "forensic origin of the discourse of sexuality" (23). He shows that "the discourse of sexuality, articulated around the concept of instinct, emerged from within the liberal rationality of political economy, and as a response to a tension or problem internal to the bourgeois economic and judicial order" (23). The third, "symbolic," register is the desire to be recognized not as the author of a particularly excellent achievement, but as a person equal before the law and hence of intrinsic worth, due dignity and respect, as well as one due a form of esteem for their quotidian "contribution to society" (24). This brings Beistegui to analyze in Part Three the discourses of self-love and self-esteem as well as their connections with identity politics.

A final general remark is in order before I treat the individual parts of the book. As is expected from a reader of Foucault and Butler, Beistegui is careful to avoid any romanticism of natural desire. He insists that desire is "framed" in different "rationalities" or different configurations of knowledge and power. One of the great resources of the government of desire, however, is that while desire is not natural in itself, it can be framed as natural, and many of Beistegui's analyses are devoted to careful unraveling of constructions of the "naturality" of desire.

Part One is entitled "Homo Oeconomicus." Chapters 1 and 2 treat the move from a negative characterization of economic desire to a "new philosophical anthropology" (37) that reworks money-desire into a natural tendency to favor one's self-interest (here we find readings of Aristotle, Hobbes, Locke, and Hume among others) and finally, via the neoliberal emphasis on competition, into a "condition of general prosperity" (37). We are also shown how political economy comes to be seen as the limit to reason of state (39) and how the market becomes a site of veridiction, as that which allows the true price to reflect the cost/demand relation (41), and finally we see law as that which pragmatically limits government interference with the free action of economic agents: "to govern is no longer to exercise a sovereign power, but to understand and facilitate the maximal expression" of liberal economic rationality (43; 58).

Chapter 3 is devoted to the analysis of "Neoliberal Governmentality," as advanced in Foucault's Birth of Biopolitics. The chapter ends with a précis of the new homo economicus as self-entrepreneur; following Foucault, Gary Becker is a main figure of these analyses. Beistegui supplements Becker with analyses drawn from Fréderic Lordon, who notes the way organizations use desire as an internal governing principle: hence the dreadful "motivation," "reflection," and "recognition" practices that take up so much of the time of contemporary workers from the shop floor to the professorial office (80).

Part 2 is entitled "Homo Sexualis." Chapter 4 shows how "from within the rationality of interest and motive, characteristic of the economic framing of desire, there emerged another rationality of desire, that of the sexual instinct" (85). Insofar as the liberal subject exhibits rational motivation by self-interest, "senseless" crimes were a practical and epistemological problem, so the concepts of natural sexual instinct, and deviations from it, arose in a way that allowed compensation "for liberal penology's inability to account for behaviors and criminal cases that could not be explained, and thus judged, from the point of view of the rationality of motive and interest, on which it was -- and still is -- based" (23). From these "forensic" origins, sexuality, given sufficiently ingenious interpretations, becomes a universal explanans (106).

In Chapter 5, Beistegui looks at the fate of desire in the de-pathologization of pleasure in Freud's early work, as well as the discourse on the death drive as "an essentially destructive form of desire" (111). He retraces three steps by which Freud establishes a desire beyond pleasure in the death drive. The first clue for Freud was repetition compulsion with no possibility of pleasure. Then, there is "ambivalence" or the love/hate relation with those close to us. The final clue, though, was World War I, where death desire is no longer an individual perversion but "public policy" (132-35). So, while socialized repression might work to counter unruly sexual desires, it didn't work for the death drive: "this war demonstrated the failure of the rationality and politics of interest to counter the most destructive desires of human beings" (135).

Beistegui criticizes Freud for the conflation of a universal biology of death and the human tendencies of aggression, cruelty, and hatred (136). At the end of the day, he concludes, Freud leads us to a form of sexual being whose death-infused desire needs not a normalizing analytic of sexuality but law and prohibition, bringing us back to sovereign rationality and the "juridico-discursive" model of power (138-39). Setting up the conclusion of his book, Beistegui asks at this dismal point in his genealogy whether we are stuck with an oscillation between normative governmentality and sovereign prohibition as models of how we are to lead our lives as desiring subjects, or whether we can break free of life as governed desiring subjects and find an "erotics that would exceed them both" (139; cf. 212).

Part Three is entitled "Homo Symbolicus" and deals with the way in which we are governed via our desires for recognition by others: recognition is a "new epistemological and normative framework within which [desire] is put to work" (167). Another key move of the book links the desire for recognition to biopolitics, just as Part 2 linked sexuality to that which exceeds the self-interest that the philosophical anthropology of economic man had posited. Here, Beistegui shows that self-love, now named "self-esteem," has also become a condition for a properly biopolitical regime: without "self-esteem" there will be "major social ills" (147); important "life outcomes" are at stake: "psychological adjustment, academic success, physical health, a healthy sex life, relationship satisfaction" (163-64). Beistegui has a nice analysis of unsatisfiable desire here, tying the need to educate and support self-esteem to the marketing of dissatisfaction (165).

Chapter 6 is structured by Rousseau's distinction between amour-de-soi or self-preserving self-love, and amour propre, self-love reflected back to us from the esteem granted us by others. Like self-interest in its imbrication with money-desire, amour propre is unlimited, but it "exceeds the purely economic regime of desire" (144). Beistegui shows how amour propre becomes the contemporary desire for recognition by being universalized via moral and legal concepts of respect and dignity and individualized via social prestige and cultural esteem (152). Herein lies the rub, for legal respect and dignity don't satisfy individualized amour propre. Axel Honneth is Beistegui's guide here in showing how we can all be recognized for our individual contributions to social utility (160). This is a slippery target however, as different groups will have different views of social utility, so power interpretations are at work, setting up the "recognition is always misrecognition" critique Beistegui develops in his last two chapters.

Chapters 7 and 8 treat the problem of identity politics in liberal regimes. Beistegui marshals arguments that power relations are always asymmetrical when a minority group asks for recognition of its specificity from a state. The main example Beistegui uses here is Patchen Markell's analysis of Jewish emancipation in Prussia: state recognition of Jews as citizens thereby enables a raft of statistical comparisons facilitating state management, rather than rabbinical control, of biopolitical issues like birthright, marriage, inheritance (175-80). Beistegui turns to Judith Butler's claims about the conceptual pair "recognition -- misrecognition" to highlight the way even successful recognition possesses its "own risks of exclusion, fixed identities, and excesses of power" (189).

At this point, toward the end of Chapter 8, and continuing on into the Conclusion, the book turns most explicitly to the "critical" aspect of "critical ontology," encapsulated by Beistegui in a quote from Butler: "the juncture from which critique emerges, where critique is understood as an interrogation of the terms by which life is constrained in order to open up the possibility of new modes of living" (192; quoting Undoing Gender, 4). The turn to Deleuze and Guattari as major interlocutors also occurs here, setting up the Conclusion. The call is to find a way to live that embraces a creative, rather than governed, desire; this would be, it is hoped, the "opposite of, and a real alternative to, identity politics" (207).

As I noted above, the Conclusion, entitled "Desire, Again . . . " relies upon Deleuze and Guattari in a way that may leave inexperienced readers behind. Those who have the requisite background will recognize the two main ways in which Beistegui proposes to live otherwise, to live an "anarchistic" life, a life that is the "art of being governed less, or differently" (216). The first such strategy is faire jouer ("make play" in the sense of finding the "free play" or wiggle room in a normative system), and the second is faire fuir ("make flight"). While the first relies on a notion of life as inherently normative, per Georges Canguilhem, the second follows Deleuze and Guattari in seeing life as composed of "singularities, differences, and intensities" (220). This in turn is brought into connection with the distinction in A Thousand Plateaus between the molar (normative) and molecular (creative); examples of resistance are adduced in the form of hunger strikes, occupation, disruption of summits, even suicide (as in the case of the so-called Arab Spring). Such resistance can be creative when the occupation of public space allows the creation of a different form of public life, as in the Nuit debout events in the Place de la République in Paris in 2016. Finally, flight can take the form of dropping out, non-participation, and idleness.

The book concludes by making explicit the political aspect of Beistegui's analyses. Practices of art, love, science, and politics allow for the formation of what Deleuze and Guattari call "subject-groups" which create assemblages of heterogeneous "singularities" (what I would gloss as personality traits that are difficult to classify by normalizing categories). Such practices would not rely on "knowledge" of a categorial form ("we need representatives from such and such groups on our committee") but "learning" in the sense laid out in Deleuze's Difference and Repetition of "conjugation of singularities," an experimental meshing of critical points that is necessarily practical and open-ended (226; Deleuze mentions learning to swim as something that requires, literally, experimental immersion in a new milieu). Beistegui concludes that these creative practices are those that would look to tear you away from yourself (from your life as a normalized subject of desire), to find the impersonal, singular, the "outside" (that which has not yet been coded or recognized), to become otherwise, to "extricate my desire from the norms that frame it" (228).


Butler, Judith. Undoing Gender. New York: Routledge, 2004.

Deleuze, Gilles and Guattari, Félix. Anti-Oedipus. Translated by Robert Hurley, Mark Seem, and Helen R. Lane. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1983.

Deleuze, Gilles and Guattari, Félix. A Thousand Plateaus. Translated by Brian Massumi. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987.