The Greatest Possible Being

Placeholder book cover

Jeff Speaks, The Greatest Possible Being, Oxford University Press, 2018, 175pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198826811.

Reviewed by Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Washington University in St. Louis


From a certain historical perspective, the current consensus concerning Perfect Being Theology (PBT) is surprising. One can wonder how the fundamental nature of God could be (conceived to be) in terms of being the most perfect being, especially if one finds the source of such in the 11th century.[1] What were the ancients thinking, to miss out for so long? Yet, at least since the rise of modal metaphysics in the late 1960's, the stream of endorsements by philosophers of religion is long and generally unchallenged: Richard Swinburne, Eleonore Stump, Thomas Morris, Katherin Rogers, Joshua Hoffman and Gary Rosencrantz, Mark Johnston, Michael Almeida, Brian Leftow, Michael Murphy, William Wainwright, Ed Wierenga, and (most recently) Yujin Nagasawa, to name a few.[2]

Recently, however, some opposition to PBT has surfaced, and Jeff Speaks' is the first book-length challenge to this perspective in the intellectual tradition to which the above authors belong. The book is meticulously argued and well worth the effort needed to work through the details of each argument. Some of the arguments are quite dense, but Speaks does an excellent job of providing a fly-over perspective on the general direction of the arguments. For example, he distinguishes between versions of PBT that begin from the idea of a greatest possible being ("alethic PBT") and those that talk of the greatest conceivable being ("epistemic PBT"). For epistemic PBT, the danger is that of complexity, since there are so many distinguishable accounts of conceivability. But Speaks organizes this complexity around the dual dangers of collapsing into alethic PBT (if conceivability entails possibility) and introducing "trouble-makers," (identified by predicates that are conceivable, not possible, but better to instance than not). This Scylla-Charibdys strategy allows readers to see not only the trees but the forest as they wade through more than a half-dozen proposals about how to understand conceivability.

The strategy of the book begins with two tasks. The first part aims to dismantle PBT pretensions at being able to derive central theological commitments about God, such as the standard omni-properties or slight emendations of them as one finds in Open Theism. This task breaks into two, one concerning alethic PBT and the other epistemic PBT. Central to Speaks' argumentation is the epistemological concern that the reach of modal space isn't something that is a given, and that a central failure of PBT is that if modal space is much more constrained that we might have thought, then PBT will mis-identify some modestly impressive non-deity with God.

The two key weapons that Speaks uses in this section are an entailment requirement and an informativeness requirement. These requirements generate two central problems for PBT, the problem of trumping and the problem of triviality. The problem of trumping arises when we find a great-making candidate property, but that property can be trumped by other properties and thus is blocked as a property of God. As Anselm noted, it is better to be just and not wise than wise and not just, and this trumping phenomenon introduces the need for complications in the attempt to show that PBT entails some features of God, and does so in a way that we can discern which properties those are. The problem of triviality arises when we discover that a perfect being would either have or lack a certain property essentially, and then try to use the claim that having that property is possible to discover that God has the property essentially. Here, Speaks remarks,

But we already know . . . that God is necessarily F or necessarily not F. And, given this, the claim that God is possibly F is trivially equivalent to the conclusion -- that God is F -- for which we wished to argue. This means that, to see whether some candidate property satisfies the first conjunct of [the relevant criterion for being a divine attribute], we already need to know something which is trivially equivalent to the claim that that property is a property of God. Hence [the criterion] can never yield the result that a given property is among the divine attributes without being given as input something trivially equivalent to just that.

Let's call this the problem of triviality. The problem of triviality shows that [the proposal] fails our [Informativeness] desideratum in an especially dramatic way, for we can derive nothing from [the proposal] about God that we do not already bring to our inquiry. (p. 32)

The Informativeness desideratum claims that "it should be possible (without reliance on prior substantive claims about God) to see that some interesting candidates to be divine attributes satisfy the [greatness] condition." (p. 12)

It is worth nothing the ubiquity of situations of this sort for PBT. Quite a few candidates for great-making properties are thought to be essential if possible and impossible otherwise. So the problem of triviality has a long reach. My concern about the problem, though, is that the epistemology doesn't quite follow from the metaphysics. It is true that the possibility claim is modally equivalent to the conclusion sought, but the informativeness requirement is about using some claims as evidence for other claims, and sometimes modally equivalent claims still have the desired structure where one of them can be epistemically prior to the other and thus constitute evidence for it. There is thus at least a small amount of wiggle room for a defender of PBT to exploit here, though I note that epistemic priority, especially in modal contexts, is not well-understood.

Next comes a less constructive use of PBT, one aimed at limiting the amount of tinkering that can be done in one's theology to avoid objections. The idea here is to use the notion of a perfect being to distinguish between dispensable and indispensable aspects of theology: if a feature can be given up without compromising the status of being the most perfect being, then that feature is dispensable.

Here Speaks presents a compelling reductio argument against such a maneuver, applying it to both alethic and epistemic PBT. The basic problem is that the strategy overreaches. To see the direction the argument takes, just imagine that atheism is true but that there is a greatest actual being (Speaks wants us to think of Michael Jordan here, but even this devoted Carolina fan had to chuckle a bit at the idea). Then add fallibility to the story, fallibility about the reach of modal space: suppose we are mistaken enough that only what is actual is possible. Then the defensive strategy would imply that Michael Jordan is God, but that contradicts the original supposition that atheism is true. Moreover, similar problems result if the space of possibility is enlarged a bit, but still restricted enough so that the greatest in that space is still unworthy of the category of deity.

There is also a suggestive chapter concerning the possibility of conflicts between the properties PBT-ers hope to derive from their theological starting point and hidden attributes of God that have to be affirmed as well. Speaks proposes that our credence that there will be conflicts here has to be quite high, and that such a high credence causes further problems for PBT.

Though suggestive, arguments aimed at delimiting the range of appropriate credences strike me as failing to see that, at best, normative restrictions on appropriate credences are hard to find except at the level of entire systems of information. For those who like to distinguish narrow-scope from wide-scope normative requirements, we can put the point in terms of limiting normative restrictions on credences to wide-scope requirements about impermissible combinations of credences. Even here, though, hesitation is in order: attention to the holistic character of rationality should make us wonder whether any wide-scope requirements exist except at the level of entire systems of information.[3] For those traversing the epistemological landscape with foundationalist and linearity blinders on, it is easy to think that we can make progress by arguing for appropriate credal ranges for central claims or presuppositions, but, as I read it, the story of epistemology in the twentieth century is one in which the attractions of coherentism show the need to drop the blinders.[4]

This reservation does not imply that such argumentation is of no value, however, for even if the specific claims about legitimate credences overreach, the discussion still puts pressure on views that incorporate credences that fall outside the recommended levels. That is, they show the need for showing how one can both endorse the premises that Speaks uses to support the recommended credence levels while at the same time rejecting these recommendations. Trying involves shouldering the burdens of defeasible reasoning, a quite ordinary task, but one where the arguments developed make the task an imposing one. Suffice it to say that it isn't clear what is needed to avoid Speaks' recommendations in this chapter.

These parts form the core of the book, though the book also contains a helpful chapter about semantic attempts to tie the language of perfection of being with language about God. One can think of the appeal to semantics as a kind of last-ditch effort to save a role for perfect being thinking, with the idea being that 'God' is not an ordinary name, but rather a name with a delimiting descriptive aspect, one involving the greatest possible being. Speaks reveals a number of difficulties facing this proposal, in the end agreeing that the name 'God' is not an ordinary name but wisely questioning whether the descriptive content could be what a defender of PBT needs it to be.

Here I found myself less sympathetic to the PBT demand that the name 'God' not be an ordinary name. Speaks considers various arguments for this conclusion and finds them wanting, but in the end endorses the following line of reasoning:

there seem to be certain descriptions of the world which are coherent, but would be incoherent if 'God' were an ordinary name. Here is an example of the sort of thing I have in mind:

God exists and created the world and everything in it. But God stayed remote from God's creation, and in particular never directly encountered any human being. No one has ever in any sense perceived God, or communicated with God.

It seems to me that this is a perfectly coherent view; it is not far off of the view which some classical deists seem to have had. Further, it seems to me, someone might hold this view while being a perfectly competent user of the name 'God.'

But this is difficult to understand if 'God' really is dubbing-introduced. For if 'God' is dubbing-introduced, then introducers of the name must have had some prior way of making singular reference to the bearer of the name. And if God stays remote from creation, and never encounters any human being via perception or communication, how could introducers of the name have secured such original reference, if not indirectly via description? (pp. 165-6)

This argument is a gracious effort to be able to find some truth in PBT semantics, but it conflicts with standard accounts of divine conservation which mesh nicely with accounts of creation presupposed in the deistic story above: the continued existence of the created order is as much in need of explanation as is the point of origin. If so, the deistic hypothesis has failed to notice the ubiquity of divine intimacy with creation, an intimacy that can provided the needed backdrop for notions of divinity to arise as ordinary names.

As noted already, though, the issue of whether 'God' is an ordinary name isn't crucial to the discussion. For even if Speaks makes a gift of the descriptive element to defenders of PBT, getting from that starting point to a PBT version of that descriptive element faces seemingly insurmountable obstacles, as Speaks documents.

The general picture that emerges is that PBT doesn't have the resources needed for deriving more specific claims about God, that our concept of God cannot be so thin as PBT imagines, and that PBT cannot provide the fundamental or foundational starting point that its defenders had hoped for. The book closes with an enticing look at what post-PBT philosophical theology might look like. Here Speaks contrasts PBT without a natural theology tradition as well as with what we might call a "Barthian" tradition, one that looks only to revelation for information about the nature of God. He then notes the legitimate desire for other alternatives:

Any path forward has to begin with assumptions about God which are more substantial, in two senses, than what is given by the modal conception of God. First, they must say something more specific about what God is like, something more than the bare claim that God is the best thing in some space of worlds. Second, in so doing, they will go beyond anything which could credibly be claimed to be a simple unpacking of the concept of God. Where should we get these assumptions? My suggestion has been that we return to the reason why questions about the nature and existence of God are of such fundamental importance. This is the question of what it would take for there to be a being to whom it makes sense to say, 'you have made us for yourself, and our hearts are restless until they rest in you.' (p. 167)

This pointing toward some different future for philosophical theology is welcome and provocative. The book presents a superb critical foundation for such a call, and I look forward to seeing further work in the direction to which Speaks points.


Leftow, Brian. 2006. "Divine Simplicity." Faith and Philosophy 23: 365-380.

Nagasawa, Yujin. 2017. Maximal God: A New Defense of Perfect Being Theism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] In fairness, it is worth noting that there are perfect being ideas and arguments to be found in Plato, the Stoics Zeno and Cicero, as well as in Augustine and Boethius, not to mention the Hebrew Bible itself (see, e.g., Leftow 2006). But the point remains that it is hard to see the conception of God as a perfect being as central to the linguistic origins of talk about deities.

[2] See Nagasawa 2017 for an argument that PBT originates with Anselm, and also for a word of caution (which I ignore here!) about identifying PBT with Anselmianism.

[3] I note the wide implications of this concern, encompassing both the attempt in this book, but also the central argument of Plantinga's argument against evolutionary naturalism and Swinburne's attempts to calculate the probability of the resurrection as well as the initial ur-prior for the existence of God.

[4] I hasten to note that this point doesn't yield an argument for coherentism over foundationalism. It only supports the idea that no epistemology can be adequate without recognizing the holistic elements involved in the notions of rationality and justification that coherentists rely on in proposing arguments for their view.