The Ground Between: Anthropologists Engage Philosophy

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Veena Das, Michael Jackson, Arthur Kleinman, and Bhrigupati Singh (eds.), The Ground Between: Anthropologists Engage Philosophy, Duke University Press, 2014, 351pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822357186.

Reviewed by Michele M. Moody-Adams, Columbia University


It is tempting to posit a fundamental antagonism between philosophical inquiry and the anthropological project of ethnography. The ethnographer typically relies on participant observation and interviews cultural "informants" in the local language; the philosopher often constructs thought-experiments and offers arguments meant to abstract from the "local" and the everyday. It may thus be thought that even when anthropology and philosophy address similar concerns about the human condition, philosophy will involve a kind of "distance" from the world that is antithetical to the ethnographer's concern to understand the details of human experience.

The editors of The Ground Between have assembled a group of stimulating and insightful essays that challenge this way of thinking about the relationship between anthropology and philosophy. The twelve essays show that questions of philosophical importance regularly arise in and from the practice of anthropology, and that ethnographic practice is sometimes greatly enriched by philosophical reflection on how best to answer those questions. The book thus embodies the kind of productive appreciation of philosophy's value that shaped Clifford Geertz's reliance on Ryle's notion of "thick description" in producing his work on The Interpretation of Cultures.

Of course, as the editors helpfully observe in the introduction, anthropologists engage with philosophy in many different ways, and the volume's essays reflect that variety. Much of that engagement presupposes the idea that philosophy and anthropology will confront similar problems or "puzzles" when they seek to understand the human condition. One such problem is the threat of ethnocentrism, and even solipsism, that often attends the effort to understand "the other." Vincent Crapanzano's "Must We Be Bad Epistemologists?" provocatively considers the difficulties of determining "the parameters of -- and evidence for -- our knowledge and understanding of the other." Some of the other essays show that skepticism about the possibility of understanding the other often arises unavoidably from "within the ordinary" world itself, and not just as a function of the theoretical distance assumed by the philosopher or the anthropologist. In "Action, Expression and Everyday Life: Recounting Household Events," Veena Das compellingly draws from the lessons of her fieldwork among low-income families in Delhi, India to discuss the implications of Stanley Cavell's account of the "uncanniness of the ordinary." A third area of common ground in the volume is the domain of persistent challenges of meaning and translation that confront philosophy and ethnography working in cross-cultural contexts (or their equivalents). Didier Fassin's "The Parallel Lives of Philosophy and Anthropology" reflects on the ironies of Middle East conflict as a way of exploring the possibility that some aspects of human experience will always resist "philosophical reduction as well as anthropological interpretation" (70).

One area that one might have expected to be discussed in these musings is the kind of radical relativism that alleges the existence of "many worlds," rather than a single world with many different "versions." In their introduction, the editors briefly discuss this challenge through an engagement with Nelson Goodman's arguments in Ways of Worldmaking. But none of the ethnographic essays in the volume take up the debate, notwithstanding the fact that controversies over defenses of the "many worlds" views and the idea of "multiple ontologies" have been raging in journal articles and at national conferences in anthropology for at least a decade.

Yet even as this volume explores many important dimensions of the common ground between anthropology and philosophy, some of its contributors wisely remind us that there are still persistent tensions between the disciplines. Some of these tensions lead ethnographers to insist on the need to strike a balance between philosophical distance and ethnographic detail. Thus Michael Jackson, in"Ajàlá's Heads: Reflections on Anthropology and Philosophy in a West African Setting," develops the concept of fieldwork as a constant "dialectic between engagement and disengagement" (27). In his discussion of "Ethnography in the Way of Theory," João Biehl even speculates that academic philosophy is too prone to impenetrable prose and insular debates, and that, as a consequence, it runs the risk of stripping people's "lives, knowledge and struggles of their vitality -- analytical, political and ethical." Biehl's complaint is also directed at other ethnographers who believe (regrettably) that ethnography is ultimately valuable only is so far as it makes some kind of contribution to "theory."

The extent to which contemporary ethnography has become a self-conscious, "self-reflexive," and fundamentally self-critical activity is evident in many of the essays. Some philosophers will be surprised and even puzzled by this fact. But, as a discipline, ethnography has rightly felt the need to come to terms with its origins in the context of colonialism, and the question of whether, even unwittingly, the claims of the (mostly western) "outsider" to be able to provide authoritative understandings of another's way of life might be inextricably bound up with the effort to dominate the other.

The emergence of self-conscious concern about the authority of ethnographic discourse, and about the legacy of ethnography's (sometimes unwitting) role in colonialism, may help to explain why an issue that was once central to encounters between philosophy and anthropology is not discussed by the contributions to The Ground Between. The "problem of apparently irrational beliefs" and related debates about the implications of differences between "modern rational thought" and "primitive" thought gets virtually no attention in the ethnographic essays. As the editors note, in the introduction, anthropological interest in such issues waned as ethnographers came to believe that they could -- and should -- recognize that there are different ways of thinking without claiming authority to pronounce on the superiority of some modes of thinking over others. Ethnographers have also been concerned to scrutinize the reliability of their empirical methods, and even the central concepts -- perhaps especially the concept of culture -- that figure in their accounts. These essays reveal that philosophy is sometimes a hindrance to this self-reflection -- especially in those contexts where, to reverse Biehl's phrase, "theory gets in the way of ethnography."

Yet other essays suggest that philosophy can sometimes be an indispensable aid to ethnographic self-scrutiny. Perhaps most striking in this regard is Arthur Kleinman's "The Search for Wisdom: Why William James Still Matters." First, it is one of two "auto-ethnographies" in the volume: essays that reflect on experiences and assumptions of the ethnographer in "everyday life" rather than on the lessons of fieldwork in some faraway locale. Implicit in these projects -- in Kleinman's auto-ethnography, as well as in Ghassan Hage's essay discussing the theoretical implications of a battle with progressive hearing loss -- is the idea that reflecting on the experience of the ethnographer can reveal important facts about both the enterprise of ethnography and the relevance of philosophy to that enterprise. Some philosophers may be puzzled by the assumptions that underwrite these auto-ethnographies, not finding any analog in their own discipline. But even in the case of "ordinary" fieldwork, the ethnographer must confront the fact that the ethnographer can never really stop being a human subject whose reactions constantly "threaten" to make their way into observations. This means that the responsible ethnographer is, in some sense, constantly engaged in scrutiny of the ethnographic stance. All of the essays, though especially the pieces by Kleinman and Hage, remind us that self-conscious scrutiny of the ethnographer's reactions and response is a necessary prelude to reliable observations, and can often have a salutary effect on the ethnographic endeavor as a whole.

But Kleinman's essay is striking in a second way, for it concludes with a powerful challenge to philosophers as well as anthropologists to return to a vision of the "search for knowledge" as something we undertake to assist us in "the art of living." Kleinman recounts his return to the work of William James in two moments of crisis and extreme loss in his own life, out of the conviction that for James "philosophy was lived, it was not an abstraction." He goes on to criticize those anthropologists and philosophers who cultivate "the recondite, the otiose . . . and the merely clever" (134), and who thereby encourage the contemporary tendency to think that disciplines such as anthropology and philosophy don't matter for educated people. Ultimately, Kleinman convincingly argues that the revitalization of anthropology and philosophy depends upon each discipline recognizing the value of the other, and being willing to change in response to the encounters that are likely to result. Because the book's essays explore what the editors call the "affinities and antagonisms" between anthropology and philosophy, they help lay the groundwork for the kind of intellectual encounters that Kleinman envisions.

One shortcoming of the volume is the absence of any attempt by the editors to explain the appeal of particular philosophers to anthropologists engaged in the ethnographic enterprise. In their introduction they rightly observe that "what constitutes philosophy or a philosophical moment . . . within a practice that does not explicitly claim to be doing philosophy" is an open question (25). But philosophers trained in the analytic tradition may not fully understand why so many of the contributors are drawn to the work of Deleuze and Guattari, and to their understanding of philosophy as "the discipline that involves creating concepts." The essays that appeal to this vision of philosophy do little to enlighten us about why this vision of the subject might be of special value to their work. Still further, philosophers trained primarily in the continental tradition may not fully appreciate the value to ethnographers of philosophical arguments from J. L. Austin, or Cavell and Wittgenstein. The essay by Das goes some way toward explaining the appeal of Cavell's interest in "ordinary life" to her project, but even here, the uninitiated reader might profit from a fuller explanation of the philosophical theories in question and their relevance to ethnography.

Yet on the whole, The Ground Between is a welcome and valuable addition to the literature on the relationship between anthropology and philosophy. It convincingly encourages us to seek new ways for two disciplines concerned with an important common subject -- the nature and limits of the human -- to talk with, rather than past, each other.