The Grounds of Ethical Judgement: New Transcendental Arguments in Moral Philosophy

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Illies, Christian, The Grounds of Ethical Judgement: New Transcendental Arguments in Moral Philosophy, Oxford, 2003, 240pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198238320.

Reviewed by Pekka Vayrynen, University of California, Davis


In this intriguingly old-fashioned book, Christian Illies argues that any rational agent must acknowledge certain moral values or principles to be universal and objectively valid, on the pain of “normative inconsistency”.

Chapter 1 locates Illies’ project in the framework of debates about moral realism, which Illies understands as the conjunction of three theses: (A) we can make moral judgments with literal truth-values that we are able to determine; (B) there are moral facts, which exist independently of our evidence for them; and (C) it is an analytic truth about moral judgment that if the person sincerely judges y to be morally better than ¬y, then she has a motive to do or support y (3-6). It is worth noting that many contemporary moral realists don’t sign on to the motivational internalism of (C) and many regard the epistemic component of (A) as a further claim, not a part of realism.

Illies’ project is old-fashioned in its dizzying ambition, which is comparable to the Cartesian program in epistemology. Illies thinks that the only adequate way to discharge the realist’s heavy burden of proof is to demonstrate that there is at least one fundamental moral principle or value which is rationally justified. He takes the rational justification of a moral principle or value to consist in giving a reason why any rational agent must accept it, by showing that there is no consistent alternative to acknowledging its authority (14-15). His opponent isn’t an epistemological skeptic, but someone who positively denies the existence of objective universal moral values.

Illies dismisses inductive, intuitionist, and contractualist methods in ethics as inadequate to the task of providing this kind of a rational justification for ultimate normative principles, and claims that ordinary deductive methods can’t justify their own starting points without circularity, dogmatism, or infinite regress (17-28).

Chapter 2 introduces transcendental argument – argument designed to show that something must be the case for some fact or state of affairs to be possible – as an alternative method of rational justification of normative principles, which promises to succeed against skeptics where the methods dismissed in Chapter 1 fail.

Illies distinguishes two types of transcendental argument, the “explorational” and the “retorsive” type. The former proceed from a synthetic a priori judgment q about the existence of some fact to its conclusion p via an a priori strict conditional that p is a uniquely necessary condition of q in every possible world (33-36). Illies argues that explorational arguments fail rationally to justify normative principles on the (not, to my mind, fully convincing) grounds that any non-normative starting-point q leads to the naturalistic fallacy, but the skeptic can reasonably question any normative starting-point (41-42). The burden of rational justification falls on retorsive arguments.

In general, the retorsive type of transcendental argument is “designed to show that some judgement r is true because it cannot be rejected rationally” (45). Assuming r, one argues, by the “transcendental conditional” to the effect that any assertion of ‘¬r’ requires commitment to r, that ‘¬r’ can’t be asserted consistently with r. Therefore (assuming bivalence), r. Sound retorsive arguments would thus show that skepticism about r presupposes the truth of r, on the basis of the implications of the “performative conditions” necessary for asserting any intelligible negation of ’r’ by a rational being in any circumstances (52).

The core of the book lies in Illies’ “argument from normative consistency” (ANC) in Chapter 5: every agent’s freedom to act and every agent’s making of true judgments are rationally justified as objective universal values which command everyone’s respect because denying that they have such value is “normatively inconsistent” (129). ANC is supposed to avoid the flaws of two retorsive arguments – Apel’s “argument from discourse” and Gewirth’s “argument from agency,” which Illies describes and criticizes in Chapters 3-4 – for the requirement to respect all rational agents. Chapter 6 returns to the book’s ostensible framework to argue that ANC, if sound, establishes a form of moral realism. I focus my remarks on ANC.

Illies presents the argument for the universal objective value of every agent’s ability to make true judgments as having seven steps. The first premise

(1) We necessarily make judgments that have truth values.

is argued retorsively: to make an intelligible contribution, the skeptic must suppose that her own judgments are true or false.

Illies’ next step is to argue retorsively from (1) that the activity of making judgments with truth values commits any judge, at least implicitly, to regarding it as good that she makes true judgments (134-138). So, I am necessarily committed to judging:

(2)My making true judgments is good. (NTJ)

Illies next relies on the undefended assumption that a good is something to which a “practical pro-attitude” is appropriate (140) to derive from (2) the requirement to see a pro-attitude towards one’s own making of true judgments as appropriate:

(3)In judging, I ought to aim at making true judgments. (T!)

To determine whether NTJ and T! concern something which everyone must regard as a positive value – a “universal”, or, better, an agent-neutral value – Illies offers a “truth criterion” for value judgments (143-144):

(4)If there were some state of affairs which everyone had to regard as a positive value (as good), and if this evaluation were consistent with other rational judgments that we must make, then this state would rightly be regarded as a positive value.

This spells out what it would be to have a retorsive argument for a universal value: if a state of affairs satisfies (4), not even a skeptic can deny that it has universal value.

Since NTJ itself is a judgment that has a truth value, T! applies to NTJ: one should make NTJ only if it is true. But each person is necessarily committed to making NTJ. So if NTJ were false, each agent would fall into the normative inconsistency of being committed to making a false judgment she shouldn’t, by T!, make. Thus we get:

(5) We have a necessary pro-attitude toward NTJ being true.

But how exactly is the commitment in (5) to be understood? Should anyone other than a given agent x see x’s making of true judgments as good? Illies’ next step is to reject the commitment in (6) to regard the making of true judgments as having merely agent-relative value:

(6) My truth-judging is a good exclusively for me, in the sense that it is something that I but not anyone else must value.

Illies’ argument against (6) as the proper way to understand (5) is that judging (6) leads to an infinite regress of certain meta-level value judgments (150). (See below.)

The final step of Illies’ argument aims to establish (7) as the commitment in (5):

(7) My truth-judging as much as everyone else’s truth-judging is a good for everyone, in the sense that everyone must value everyone’s truth-judging.

Since all rational agents are committed to NTJ but we can’t understand that commitment as (6), (7) is the only consistent way to understand it (cf. 174). (Illies rightly dismisses the mediating claim that only my truth-judging is a good for everyone.) But if commitment to (7) is the only consistent way to meet the necessary self-directed demand in T!, “it follows that everyone must have a positive pro-attitude towards truth being a universal positive value” (152) – even the skeptic. By (4), truth-judging is a positive universal value. Given Illies’ claim that universal values are moral values (80-81), truth-judging is a moral value and T! is a moral demand (155).

Illies extends this argument to the universal positive value of freedom to act. As an agent, I must judge (NF): ’My freedom to act is good’ (159). Given T!, I must judge NF only if it is true. By (4), NF is false if it says that freedom is a good exclusively for me (has mere agent-relative value). Therefore, the only normatively consistent way for any agent to satisfy her necessary commitment to NF is to regard everyone’s freedom to act (so long as it doesn’t curtail other agents’ freedom) as good (159-161). So, freedom to act is a universal, and therefore a moral good.

Many of the steps in ANC are objectionable, but I will note only a few. First, to what values does ANC generalize? To determine this, we need to determine whether, for a given value, the analogue of (6) is preferable to the analogue of (7). The form of Illies’ infinite-regress objection to (6) seems to apply to any analogue of (6):

If something is a value for me but for no one else then this can be expressed as follows: There is an epistemological (or normative) system [e.g., my system of values] which allows value judgements about components of a system in relation to each other… . If I say ’y is truly good exclusively for me’, I am speaking about the relation between components in the system from outside the system; otherwise the claim to truth would be vague and pointless… . Yet what are the truth-conditions of this meta-level evaluation? If we say that, again, it is only true that it is good for me that this meta-level judgement is true, then we face an infinite regress of meta-systems. (150)

Although I don’t fully understand this objection, Illies seems to face a dilemma. If the objection can be raised to any analogue of (6), then ANC seems to show too much. It can seemingly be used to argue, implausibly, that desiring what one believes to be the necessary means to the ends one pursues – a necessary commitment of any rational agent and a basic requirement of practical reason – must have universal positive value, if it can truly be said to require any pro-attitude at all. But if there is a problem with the objection, Illies’ crucial step to (7) is problematic.

One problem with the objection to (6) which Illies fails to address is this: Why not see someone who says ’y is truly good exclusively for me’ as judging in accordance with her system of values? On ethical subjectivism, for instance, an intolerant person isn’t making a meta-judgment about her moral code, but rather is judging truly in accordance with that code, when she says ’It would be truly wrong for me to tolerate same-sex marriage’. This is a consistent view: as is well-known, the best way for the subjectivist – and the moral relativist – to avoid regarding inconsistent moral judgments as true is to treat moral judgments as having relational truth conditions. Ethical subjectivists and relativists won’t be convinced by Illies’ objection to (6).

Another worry about the move to (7) stems from the fact that NTJ is consistently universalizable without commitment to (7), as follows:

(8) For any agent x and any proposition p: if p is true, x’s judging that p is good (for x).

Judging (8) commits me to judging that others are required make certain judgments. But it doesn’t commit me to placing agent-neutral or “universal” value on others’ truth-judging, as opposed to my acknowledging the agent-relative value to any given agent of her making true judgments. (Compare the parallel case of ethical egoism.)

It is hard to be sure why Illies is oblivious to this option, but I am inclined to fault the undefended assumption bridging the move from (2) to (3) that regarding something as a good entails a commitment to a “practical pro-attitude”. This inference is fallacious in the case of regarding something as an agent-relative good for another person. In ignoring the distinction between agent-neutral and agent-relative values, Illies appears to ignore normatively consistent ways to accept NTJ and satisfy T! short of accepting (7) and its analogues.

Space allows me to mention only briefly worries one might have about NTJ and T!, which point to important respects in which the book is under-researched. (i) Illies fails to address the much-debated issue of whether we typically have the goal of believing the truth at all (Stich 1988) and, even if we do, whether it is a goal we share only contingently (Kornblith 1993; Nozick 1993). He simply asserts that we are necessarily committed to making true judgments whenever judging at all (143), instead of arguing the point (see e.g. Williams 1978; Velleman 2000; Wedgwood 2002). (ii) Since NTJ doesn’t specify what sort of value I place on truth-judging (as Illies notes on 135), it is curious that we don’t hear a word of the view that the value of having true beliefs is contingent on whether having true beliefs is more conducive to practical success than having false beliefs (Kornblith 1993; cf. Horwich 2000). Illies must rebut this view, for otherwise I am not necessarily committed to regarding my own – let alone everyone’s – truth-judging as good. (iii) If I am subject to T! only insofar as believing the truth is (a part of) an efficient way of getting what I want, whatever it is that I want (Kornblith 1993), T! is a covertly hypothetical imperative. Illies must rebut this view also, for ANC requires that T! be a categorical imperative.

I turn finally to (4). My remarks above imply that if (4) is the only truth criterion for normative judgments, true judgments of agent-relative value are impossible. That result would strike me as implausible. Surprisingly, Illies fails to mention that (4) is a dead ringer for Korsgaard’s (1986) “rationalist” theory of value – according to which a state of affairs has value if it is necessarily valued by rational agents – and has no discussion at all of Korsgaard’s (1996) influential transcendental argument for the universal value of rational agency. Not only is Illies fairly expected to say why ANC provides a preferable route to that conclusion. Taking account of the extensive critical literature on Korsgaard’s appeal to the rationalist theory of value would also advance the defense of (4) – if Illies gave us any full defense of (4), that is.

Illies’ defense of (4) boils down to this: “Nothing can be necessary for everyone, and hence have full authority, and be wrong in some further sense at the same time” (145). But many moral realists think that we may be rationally required to make judgments which happen to be false, since they think that truth is recognition-transcendent. By contrast, (4) implies that normative truth is constrained by the capacities for rational recognition. (4) is much closer to a constructivist than to a realist criterion of normative truth. At most (4) yields procedural realism – which Korsgaard (1996: 35) and others regard as compatible with moral anti-realism and which Illies himself sees as questioning thesis (B) of moral realism (5). The book would be a less frustrating read if its constructivist tendencies were more explicit – and defended.

Illies fails to make a convincing transcendental case for objective universal values. The book does offer much that is valuable to those with a special interest in transcendental arguments in ethics (including ample references to contemporary German discussions of these issues), but it is unlikely to be useful in most teaching and shouldn’t be used as a primer on contemporary moral realism. I was also put off by Illies’ baroque grammatical constructions and frequently clichéd turns of phrase. (This excerpt, from 129, is not untypical: “With such tools we may be enabled to discover the solid rock of truth upon which we may set the foundation of the ambitious edifices of the three theses of moral realism.”) But I can recommend the book to a wider audience for instructive shortcomings. Even if its shortcomings won’t be a ghastly surprise to you – say, because you already think that the standards of rational justification with which Illies operates doom us to skepticism much in the way that the Cartesian program in epistemology does – they may be educational. Illies’ arguments are often more detailed than the arguments we find in comparable contemporary projects. Insofar as the devil lies in the details of these projects, studying The Grounds of Ethical Judgement may help us better to assess the prospects of defending fundamental moral principles by transcendental argument.


Horwich, Paul (2000). “Norms of Truth and Meaning.” In Philosophy, the Good, the True and the Beautiful, ed. Anthony O’Hear, 19-34. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kornblith, Hilary (1993). “Epistemic Normativity.” Synthese 94: 357-376.

Korsgaard, Christine M. (1986). “Aristotle and Kant on the Source of Value.” Reprinted in Creating the Kingdom of Ends, 225-248. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

Korsgaard, Christine M. (1996). The Sources of Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Nozick, Robert (1993). The Nature of Rationality. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Stich, Stephen (1990). The Fragmentation of Reason. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Velleman, J. David (2000). “On the Aim of Belief.” In The Possibility of Practical Reason, 244-281. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Wedgwood, Ralph (2002). “The Aim of Belief.” Philosophical Perspectives 16: 267-297.

Williams, Bernard (1978). Descartes: The Project of Pure Inquiry. Harmondsworth: Penguin.