The Habermas-Rawls Debate

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James Gordon Finlayson, The Habermas-Rawls Debate, Columbia University Press, 2019, 294pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231164115.

Reviewed by Wilfried Hinsch, Universität zu Köln


James Gordon Finlayson's book gives us a well-informed and detailed account of the exchange between Habermas and Rawls about questions of political justice and legitimacy. Finlayson discusses both the exchange which took place in the 1990s and the ensuing academic debate which continues today. He analyses both the exchange and the debate with lucidity and shows fair judgment when it comes to assessing arguments and counter-arguments. The book also contains helpful sketches of Habermas's political discourse ethics in Between Facts and Norms and Rawls's account of justice and legitimacy in Political Liberalism. Beginners and more advanced scholars will benefit from the clarity and determination with which Finlayson sorts out ubiquitous misunderstandings, especially concerning the Original Position -- the much-discussed centerpiece of Rawls's conception of justice as fairness -- and the idea of an overlapping consensus in Rawls's political liberalism.

Finlayson reminds us that the setup of the Original Position -- ideally rational agents choosing principles of justice behind a veil of ignorance -- was never meant to describe the social life of moral persons or the complexities of their mutual relations. Nor was it meant to provide a natural law- or right-based justification for Rawls's two principles. The Original Position is simply an organizational device employed by Rawls to lay out the premises of his argument in a neat and perspicuous way. Moreover, we are reminded that the device of the Original Position is used within the framework of a reflective equilibrium approach in moral theory which connects the two principles of justice with the understandings and moral judgments of ordinary citizens in a liberal democracy.

The idea of an overlapping consensus refers to a consensus of comprehensive moral and religious doctrines which, in spite of existing differences, partly intersect and which support a shared political conception of justice. Finlayson rightly rejects the view that the consensus is primarily needed in order to secure social or political stability. Rawls's political liberalism builds on a consensus between reasonable comprehensive doctrines which has to be a reasoned consensus based on moral deliberation and critical reflection. Its practical function is not to secure stability simpliciter but stability for the right reasons. Needless to say, then, an overlapping consenus is not merely "descriptive". It presupposes an understanding of what are right reasons and what is reasonable in the domain of political justice.

Finlayson also dismisses another, related criticism. Suppose there is an overlapping consensus in support of generally accepted principles. Citizens who hold partly incompatible comprehensive moral or religious views may still appear to lack shared reasons and a common perspective when it comes to questions of right and wrong in politics. All things told, they endorse the political conception in the light of their respective comprehensive doctrines. Citizens may accept the same principles of justice, but they do so, one may conclude, for different reasons, reasons which partly pertain to the controversial parts of their comprehensive views.

Much depends here on how we conceive of "shared reason" and a "common perspective." Rawls's conception of a freestanding political conception addresses these questions. A conception of justice is freestanding if it is neither presented as a comprehensive doctrine -- a moral or religious doctrine the principles and values of which go well beyond questions of political justice and, in the limit, cover all areas of life -- nor as derived from one (Political Liberalism, p. 12). Rather a freestanding conception is based on widely shared political ideas and values which taken together suffice to justify the conception without reliance on contested comprehensive moral or religious views.

Now, every justification rests on limited numbers of premises and, hence, can be supplemented by further reasons in support of its premises or conclusions. In any case, practical arguments succeed only pro tanto. They can be defeated -- notwithstanding their supposedly accepted premises -- by additional considerations and premises that have not yet been taken into account. More specifically, even with an overlapping consensus in support of it, the justification of a freestanding political conception can in principle be defeated, because of considerations that derive from controversial parts of comprehensive doctrines. This does not mean, however, that it ceases to be a justification. And if we assume the existence of an overlapping consensus, it is a justification which is based on the shared reasons in the overlap. Moreover, as it stands, the justification has not been defeated on the basis of controversial but reasonable considerations. Otherwise there would be no consensus about the freestanding conception in the first place. Hence, if there is an overlapping consensus, citizens, in spite of their partly incompatible comprehensive views, do share a common point of view: the freestanding political conception of justice and the agreed upon reasons that justify it.

Let us now turn to the main issue between Habermas and Rawls: the proper understanding of democratic legitimacy. I sympathize with Finlayson's observation that Rawls says rather too little about democratic institutions. I feel inclined, though, to draw more radical conclusions from this than Finlayson would seem to be comfortable with.

How should we conceive of the relation between a substantive moral theory of justice and a political theory of democratic legitimacy? Rawls and Habermas give different answers to this question. Following Rawls, the constitutive elements of a constitutional democracy -- basic political and liberal rights and a guaranteed social minimum, in short: the constitutional essentials -- are determined by principles of political justice. These principles, in turn, are established by substantive moral reasoning and not by any kind of democratic process. Habermas denies this. He believes that Rawls's view is inconsistent with the idea of popular sovereignty. Following Habermas, a legitimate political order has to be established by a democratic process with no (moral) principles of substantive justice in the background to tell right and wrong in advance.

As Finlayson rightly observes, any attempt to clearly separate two neatly opposed positions on democratic legitimacy in the Habermas-Rawls debate must seem futile from the start. Rawls, for his part, never claimed that political legitimacy is solely a matter of sound moral reasoning or that philosophers should have a final say about political constitutions. And Habermas, for his part, explains democratic legitimacy in a way that makes use of idealizations which many would consider to be substantive moral demands: witness his statement in Between Facts and Norms that "legitimate laws are to be such that all those affected would have been capable of passing them collectively" (Postscript from 1994, p. 458).

Habermas offers various explanations of his misgivings about Rawls's theory, some of which are ill-conceived or arise from misunderstandings. The charge that Rawls puts the individual liberties of classical liberalism above the basic rights of democratic participation and that he denies the "co-originality" of political and liberal rights seems to be widely off the mark. Also, the complaint that Rawls's account of the liberal rights "demotes the democratic process to an inferior status" (J Philos 1995, p. 128), is, as it stands, unwarranted. The pivotal point of Habermas' misgivings, however, does not rest on a misunderstanding.

Rawls distinguishes between justice and legitimacy, and he formulates a liberal principle of legitimacy which in combination with his conception of justice as fairness leads to a familiar understanding of democratic legitimacy: legitimacy as the outcome of democratic procedures within the framework of a just liberal constitution. What we do not find in Rawls's political liberalism, however, is an account of democratic constitutional legitimacy.

Habermas maintains that the process of democratic will formation has been unduly downgraded in Rawls's theory because priority is given to liberal rights over political rights. But this critique rests on a misunderstanding: neither justice as fairness nor political liberalism give pride of place to liberal rights. But there remains a problem of a more general nature. This problem concerns all basic rights -- liberal and political -- that are part of Rawls's first principle of justice.

Following the layout of Rawls's theory, all basic rights are to be determined by a political conception of justice without any recourse to the outcome of democratic decision-making procedures. Basic rights are specified solely by moral reasoning and, in this sense, are pre-political and a matter of moral theory. As a matter of political implementation, however, the same basic rights are the essential elements of a political regime -- they are legal constitutional rights of a liberal democracy -- and, hence, must be established, we assume, by a political process and not simply by moral reasoning. It is the Janus-faced character of institutionalized basic rights in Rawls's theory which brings up the problem of popular sovereignty. They are constitutive elements of a (moral) conception of justice and, at the same time, constitutive elements of positive constitutional law. The question naturally arises whether the historical process, which actually establishes a constitutional regime, in one way or another, contributes to the legitimacy of the regime. Rawls's understanding of the basic liberties as constitutional essentials appears to suggest an answer in the negative.

In the exposition of his theory, Rawls distinguishes between the Original Position which establishes the principles of justice and the implementation of the principles in a Constitutional Convention (Theory of Justice, §31). Note, though, that within the Rawlsian framework, the Convention, just like the Original Position, is merely fictitious. It takes place behind a veil of ignorance. Compared with the Original Position, the veil has been lifted a bit to allow the use of contextual and historical information about particular societies, which is needed to decide questions of constitutional design. But the veil is still there and the Convention is a counterfactual construction, a guideline of thought for the purpose of specifying the constitutional implications of justice as fairness a (J Philos 1995, pp. 151-153). What the Convention does not do and what it cannot do -- given its counterfactual nature -- is to confer democratic legitimacy on existing constitutions. Rawls's Constitutional Convention is not a model for a historical process that establishes a just constitutional regime, and, in any case, it does not involve democratic procedures for the resolution of moral and political disagreements between citizens.

Still, Rawls did not intend to do away with popular sovereignty and to have philosopher-kings decide upon the constitutions of liberal democracies. The basic rights of Rawls's first principle of justice are not best understood as constitutional essentials in the sense of positive constitutional law. Rather, they should be seen as moral requirements that any constitution has to conform with in order to be just.

Depending on circumstances, alternative constitutional provisions and arrangements would seem to meet these requirements and citizens are bound to have disagreements -- many of which will appear reasonable -- not only about the application of the principles of justice as fairness but also about the conception at large. Given the possibility of reasonable disagreement even about constitutional essentials (including the basic political and liberal rights) both in the moral and the legal sense, there is a place for democratic procedures when it comes to deciding between contested but reasonable understandings of what justice demands in terms of institutional implementation.

This line of thought should help to alleviate Habermas's misgivings. Rather than being in conflict with each other, procedural democracy and substantive justice are now seen as equally indispensable parts of democratic constitutional legitimacy. Justice defines -- in terms of basic political and liberal rights -- a framework of (necessary but in themselves insufficient) conditions for any constitution that may claim legitimate authority. Democratic procedures determine which constitutional provisions and institutional arrangements are to be established in the light of these conditions, given competing interpretations of what justice requires in terms of the adequate protection of basic political and liberal rights.

If we turn to Rawls's reply to Habermas, however, we see that this is not his line of argument. Of course, Rawls does not say that the philosophers should take over and institutionalize a just constitutional regime "beyond citizens' control." Neither does he say that democratic procedures are needed to establish a just and legitimate liberal constitution and to confer legitimacy on it. What Rawls does say is that political institutions "are the work of past generations who pass them on to us as we grow up under them" (J Philos 1995, p. 153). It is apparent also from his liberal principle of legitimacy that Rawls does not engage with the idea of a democratically legitimized constitution. The principle explains legitimacy as conformity with a constitution that meets basic demands of a contractualist conception of justice. It already presupposes the existence of a constitution, "the essentials of which all citizens as free and equal may reasonably be expected to endorse" (PL 137). It cannot therefore explain the legitimacy of the constitution itself.

The conspicuous absence of democratic constitutional legitimacy in Rawls's theory would seem to be a shortcoming of minor importance if we could safely assume that reasonable disagreement about constitutional essentials is impossible or reduceable to a small number of "hard cases" at the fringe of constitutional law. If this were the case, basic constitutional rights and provisions would derive all the moral authority one may ask for from meeting reasonable and uncontested demands of justice. All other laws about which citizens may reasonably disagree then derive their democratic legitimacy from being outcomes of a democratic process established by a just liberal constitution.

The catch is that on this interpretation Habermas's critique applies with unmitigated force: The moral authority and alleged legitimacy of the constitution itself would be established simply by moral reasoning and the process of democratic will formation would seem dispensible or, indeed "demoted" to the status of a political ritual without any relevance for the moral authority or legitimacy of the constitution. Besides, the notion of fundamental constitutional provisions that could not possibly become the subject of reasonable disagreements seems illusory. Rawls himself concedes that there is not just one reasonable conception of political justice but an array of conceptions. And since different conceptions may be expected to give different specifications of constitutional essentials both at the level of moral theory and political implementation, the question of how to decide which one obtains the authority of constitutional law arises.

To conclude: Rawls's political liberalism lays out the moral foundations of a liberal democracy and, hence, of democratic legitimacy, understood as conformity with a basically just constitution. But it does not give us an unambiguous account of democratic constitutional legitimacy. Habermas deserves full credit for having raised this issue, and not the least merit of Finlayson's instructive discussion is that it sorts out various lines of argument in the Habermas-Rawls debate and emphasizes the legitimacy issue. Still, given reasonable disagreement not only about the existence of God or the meaning of life but also about constitutional essentials, there remains the challenge of explaining the peculiar relationship between justice and democracy from the vantage point of political liberalism.