The Heart of Human Rights

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Allen Buchanan, The Heart of Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2013, 320pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199325382.

Reviewed by George Letsas, University College London


Allen Buchanan's book is a recent addition to the fast-growing field of the philosophy of human rights. The popularity of the field is hardly surprising. Since the end of the Second World War and the setting up of the United Nations, the idea of human rights has exerted a powerful moral influence around the world. Like climate change or globalization, this influence is a phenomenon that we need to understand and to subject to normative scrutiny. Buchanan's ambitious and thought-provoking book proposes a new methodology for the philosophy of human rights and uses it to suggest what a theory of human rights should look like.

Buchanan's starting point is the assertion that international law is central to the practice of human rights (the 'Practice', as he puts it). He takes this to entail that in so far as philosophers seek to explain and justify current practice, they should turn their attention to the international law of human rights. Chapters 1-4 seek to draw the implications of this methodological turn. The argument in this part is largely negative, directed against a thesis that Buchanan calls the 'mirroring view'. This is the view that international human rights law is justified in so far as it recognizes rights that have exactly the same scope as antecedent moral rights. Buchanan finds this view deeply mistaken: not all the human rights we have in morality are to be found in international law and not all rights we have in international law are to be found in the morality of human rights.

The argument that Buchanan advances against the mirroring view is this. In order to justify an area of law on the basis of moral rights, we must appeal to some aspect of the individual's circumstances, be it his interests or his status, which warrant the creation of a duty on others. Human rights law imposes a wide range of positive duties to develop institutions, to invest resources, to co-ordinate behavior and the like. Such duties however are too extensive to be grounded solely on moral regard for the person whose legal right it is. For example, the state's duty to build hospitals, train doctors and organize the provision of healthcare cannot be grounded on regard for any single individual's health. It follows that legal human rights have a much wider scope than moral human rights and that exploring the moral foundations of individual moral rights, as many philosophers have been doing, will be of little or no help in seeking to justify large parts of current human rights law. Yet we should not conclude that these parts of international human rights law are unjustified, Buchanan cautions. Instead, we must become pluralists about justification: individual moral rights is just one -- amongst many -- of the ingredients in the normative case for having an international law of human rights.

Armed with justificatory pluralism, Buchanan moves on to argue that the extensive duties that international human rights law imposes on states can be justified on non-rights-based considerations, such as duties to promote social goods and to serve the interests of people other than the right-holder. He takes this justificatory pluralism to be instrumental in character. He says for example that, absent the law, no one has a moral right to be given electoral campaign funds and media access. But creating a legal entitlement to such resources is a means to build a stable democratic process, which in turn brings about the social benefits of peace, order and physical security. The state's moral duty to promote our physical security justifies a political party's legal right to democracy, which includes the right to electoral campaign funds and media access.

What are we to make of Buchanan's methodological turn? By bracketing the issue of the morality of human rights and focusing instead on the practice of international human rights law, Buchanan aims to challenge rival theories of human rights. A better way to read his book is as asking a different question, which is no less important. The fact that philosophers who have written about human rights have not addressed the justifiability of international law does not mean that they dismiss it as a philosophical inquiry or that they disregard its significance. To use an analogy, I take it that when philosophers like T. M. Scanlon write about the morality of promising, they do not mean to dismiss the importance of justifying existing contract law doctrines. Buchanan invokes the centrality of international law to the practice of human rights, in order to chide philosophers of human rights for the 'serious omission' to engage with it (p. 10). But that is like saying that contract law is central to the practice of promising and then chiding promise theorists for not engaging with contract law. It is a mistake to think that the concept of moral human rights competes with the concept of legal human rights as to which one is more central within the 'Practice'. There are two human rights practices, not one, because there are two pertinent normative concerns: morality and legality. Each concern is central within its own normative domain, and philosophers are free to choose which normative domain to visit. It is normative concerns that individuate practices, not the other way around.

Buchanan accuses other philosophers of conceptual imperialism in that "They have assumed, without argument, that there is only one concept of human rights (namely, theirs)" (p. 10). This statement is ambiguous. Understood as the assumption that one's theory offers the correct account of the concept of human rights, it is hardly problematic. But Buchanan seems to understand it as the assumption that the concept of moral human rights and the concept of legal human rights are mutually exclusive, such that philosophical inquiry into the former rules out inquiry into the latter and vice versa. This is an implausible assumption, one that I doubt any philosopher would make.

But let us take for granted what Buchanan thinks is philosophically contentious, namely that the justification of international human rights law is a worthy and morally significant philosophical endeavor, alongside that of offering an account of the moral foundations of human rights. Is the mirroring view, against which most of the book's polemic is directed, a plausible target?

It would be an obvious mistake to argue that a legal right is justified if, and only if, it mirrors an antecedent moral right. A simple example suffices to show this. In English law, the seller of a property has the right to use the buyer's deposit, between exchange of contracts and completion, in order to purchase another property. It is not the case that this doctrine of English law is justified if, and only if, there is -- absent the law -- an individual moral right to use the seller's deposit. There clearly isn't such a moral right, yet there are perfectly sound reasons to create a legal right with that content. It normally makes property transactions more efficient, and it increases taxable revenue. Nor is it the case that English law is justified if, and only if, there is an individual moral right that there be a legal right to use the buyer's deposit. There is no moral right to have the most efficient scheme of property law possible, and English law would do no one an injustice if it does away with this right. Yet other legal rights are not like that, in that they directly track moral rights. The right to own personal property, such as one's clothes and books, is a moral right and a very weighty one. The same goes of course for the right not to be murdered, raped or tortured, all of which are pro tanto moral rights. A legal system would cause great injustice if it did not prohibit the violation of these rights. So the question is not whether all legal rights mirror antecedent moral rights with the same scope (they clearly do not), but whether particular legal rights do.

Must all rights of human rights law have the same scope as antecedent moral rights? It is not clear why anyone would think this. Rules about admissibility, time limits, interim measures, jurisdiction, and remedies are grounded on various moral principles (such as certainty, efficiency, fairness), which qualify the scope of the rights that human rights law protects. I know of no philosopher who holds the view that appeal to individual moral rights is necessary in order to justify each and every norm of international human rights law. Buchanan spends considerable time seeking to attribute the mirroring view to rival theories of human rights, none of which explicitly endorses it. And since such theories do not engage in the task of justifying existing legal norms, this attribution may be seen as unfair. A more charitable way to read them is as claiming that appeal to individual moral rights is sufficient in order to justify many, if not most, of the human rights we now have in international law. This claim is correct. When state officials torture, kidnap, murder, rape, or censor free speech, it suffices to say that international law prohibits these actions because they constitute serious violations of individual moral rights. Buchanan does not take issue with this claim, but with the very different one that "being a moral human right is sufficient for being included among international legal human rights" (p. 57). Yet this latter claim does not speak to the justifiability of existing human rights law, which is the question that the book is addressing.

Be that as it may, I want to turn to the particular legal rights that Buchanan offers as counter-examples to the mirroring view. Is he correct to say that international human rights to health, education, or fair trial are in part justified on instrumental grounds, and not because they are morally owed to the person whose legal rights they are?

This depends on the scope these rights have as a matter of law. Recall that Buchanan's argument hangs on two premises: first, that international human rights law imposes extensive positive obligations on states, and second that such obligations cannot be justified by appeal to the circumstances (be it his interests or status) of the legal right-holder. Both premises are open to challenge. Take the first one. The legal basis of the extensive obligations to which Buchanan refers is questionable. Despite the book's emphasis on legal practice, there is actually very little law in it. The rhetoric of extensive positive obligations is known from the work of the UN human rights bodies, as well as the campaigns of NGOs and human rights activists. For instance, General Comment no.14 of the UN Committee on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (CESCR) speaks of "the right to the highest attainable standard of health". But this rhetoric obscures the nature of international human rights law. According to the international treaties that provide for their creation, UN Committees do not have authority to issue legally binding opinions or judgments. They are not courts, and the rhetoric they abundantly produce is not international law. Since their dicta have no legal effect, they can inflate the scope of human rights obligations without having to worry about how such 'soft-law' duties play out at the practical level of institutional action. Nor are declarations, like the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UHDR), legally binding. Indirect arguments for the bindingness of the UDHR, based on customary or treaty law, are piecemeal and cannot make obligatory everything that the UDHR mentions, such as the right to periodic holidays with pay.

Things are very different however where international law, through treaties, makes human rights justiciable and confers legal authority on courts to deliver legally binding judgments, as in the case of the European and the Inter-American Court of Human Rights. There, the scope of positive obligations that Buchanan is talking about is very narrow and directly tracks moral rights. Individuals have to show that they have suffered an individualized harm for their application to be admissible. Through case law doctrines, such as proportionality and the margin of appreciation, international courts seek to specify the content of these abstract rights and delimit the scope of the obligations they impose on states. For example, under the European Convention on Human Rights (ECHR), there is no legal right that one's state spends a particular amount of resources for the hiring and training of policemen. But there is a legal right that the police effectively investigate a disappearance, particularly when the missing person has most likely been kidnapped by state agents. The duty of effective investigation is owed to the kidnapped person, because of the wrong done to her, and it is not merely a means to increase the population's physical security, though it may incidentally have that effect. It is to the case law of human rights courts (both international and domestic), with which Buchanan does not engage, that we must look in order to test the mirroring view.

Buchanan might reply that we need not equate legal rights with justiciable rights and that international human rights law imposes obligations on states, which need not correspond to rights that individuals can claim before any court. He says for example that he remains agnostic as to whether, if something is a legal right, it is morally justified to enforce it (p. 55). I find this puzzling, given his emphasis on legal practice and his claim that international human rights are instrumental. If international human rights law is to serve as an instrument for the extensive goals that Buchanan envisages, then it must make some normative difference with respect to institutional action. And it must do so in virtue of being law, not in virtue of inspiring activists and mobilizing lobbyists, as academic articles or political manifestos might do.

But let us suppose that the relevant institutional difference is the duty of domestic legislatures -- imposed by international law -- to enact legislation regarding the provision of education, healthcare, police protection, electoral campaigns and the like. And let us also suppose that the duties to enact such legislation are not grounded on individual rights. We still have to offer a normative account of the ground of these duties and the content of the legislation that is to be enacted. Pronouncing them as legal is question-begging, since -- unlike rights found in the case law of international courts -- they are not explicitly grounded in any of the sources of international law. And they can hardly be said to flow from the abstract language of the treaties. Nor should we equate the content of these duties with the non-binding rhetoric of UN Committees and human rights activists. The argument for the claim that international human rights law imposes such legislative duties on states must be based on one's moral judgment. It must be an argument as to why international law should impose these obligations. And here, we should be skeptical of Buchanan's instrumental account for at least two reasons.

The first is that, as Joseph Raz has pointed out, duties are not transitive regarding the means they require. The logic of Buchanan's non-rights-based account is that part of the right to education is justified as a means to raise the standard of living, and part of the right to democracy is justified as a means to raise the standard of physical security. Yet even if states have a moral duty to raise the standard of living or physical security, it would not follow that they have moral duties to take the means that are sufficient to bring about these ends. There are many ways to raise the standard of living or physical security, and the duty to do so will not dictate as mandatory any particular one. It is then left unexplained why, as a matter of international law, states are obligated to take particular means for complying with their moral duties.

The second reason to be skeptical about Buchanan's argument relates to the existence of the primary duties themselves. What does it mean to say that states have duties to raise the standard of living, health, or physical security? What is the level of health or physical security that each state is obligated to bring about? The proper way to interpret such duties is as the state's duty to distribute its available resources in a way that shows a particular attitude, namely the attitude of treating people as equals. Buchanan does emphasize the egalitarian dimension of human rights (he calls it 'status egalitarianism'), but construes it as the duty to ascribe the "same rights . . . to all", with "the same content", the "same weight" and the "same conditions of abrogation" (p. 29). The moral duty to treat people as equals however may, but need not, entail the duty to ascribe to all the same legal rights. Equality need not entail same treatment. Convicted prisoners should not have the same legal right to freedom of movement as others, nor should patients with emergency or life-threatening conditions have the same legal right to healthcare as other patients. And once we understand the state's duties in these domains (e.g., investment and distribution of resources for health and education) as derivative from the moral duty to treat people as equals, then Buchanan's attack on the mirroring view loses much of its force. The state's duty to treat people as equals is the shiny mirror image of the fundamental individual right to be treated as an equal. It is a right that relates to one's status as a human being, rather than to one's interests, and it can justify extensive duties of distributive justice on the part of the state. Whether some of these duties are imposed by international law is a different matter.

Buchanan is on firmer ground when addressing issues to do with the legitimacy of international law in chapters 5 and 6 of the book. He argues that international human rights law is a necessary condition for the legitimacy of the state-based international legal order, and that the legitimacy of international human rights institutions must be judged holistically, in virtue of the multiple functions they perform, and not just on the basis of whether they are democratic.

The greatest political philosophers of the 20th century were skeptical that the idea of human rights picks out a distinct domain of morality. Their view of human rights, to which they came late in their work, is largely reductive. John Rawls, Joseph Raz and Ronald Dworkin hold variants of what has come to be known as the 'political' conception of human rights: human rights are a sub-set of moral rights, those whose violation tarnishes the legitimacy of states. Their conception is now challenged by what John Tasioulas calls the 'orthodox' conception, which locates human rights within the realm of moral philosophy and aims to identify the rights we have simply in virtue of being human. Buchanan's The Heart of Human Rights is a valuable contribution, moving beyond the debate between the political and the orthodox conception and inviting philosophers to engage with the task of justifying human rights law. We should accept his invitation, his book is as an essential reference in the philosophy of human rights law. But there is, as yet, little reason to doubt that the legality and the morality of human rights are two hearts beating as one.