The Heart of Judgment: Practical Wisdom, Neuroscience, and Narrative

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Leslie Paul Thiele, The Heart of Judgment: Practical Wisdom, Neuroscience, and Narrative, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 321pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521864445.

Reviewed by Karen Stohr, Georgetown University


Thiele's book is oriented around the unassailable claim that practical moral judgment is both essential to ethical theorizing and practice and also comparatively understudied.  He takes for granted, rightly in my view, that the best way to acquire a rich understanding of the virtue of practical wisdom is to examine it through an interdisciplinary lens.  Thiele himself is a political theorist who is impressively well-read in other disciplines, including psychology, neuroscience, literature, and philosophy.  The book draws on its author's wide-ranging knowledge in its exploration of practical wisdom -- something that generates both its greatest strengths and its greatest weaknesses.  

The book itself is comprised of five chapters, plus an introduction and conclusion.  Thiele uses the introduction to motivate the project and set out the framework within which his discussion of practical wisdom will occur.   Chapter 1 aims at what he calls an intellectual history of practical judgment.  It consists of short discussions of practical wisdom and practical judgment in the work of philosophers and intellectuals from ancient times through the present:  Plato, Aristotle, Cicero, Machiavelli, Kant, Nietzsche, Dewey, Heidegger, Gadamer, Arendt, Derrida, Lyotard, and Rorty.  The chapter ends with a brief discussion of contemporary decision theory.   Although Thiele's overall framework is aimed at providing a philosophical account of practical wisdom, the remaining four chapters draw on work from cognitive psychology and neuroscience to support his claims about the virtue's key features.    In Chapter 2, Thiele uses scientific studies as the basis for his argument about the role of experience in laying the foundations for good judgment.   Chapter 3 employs the same approach to account for a connection between the unconscious and practical judgment, and in Chapter 4, he argues that research in neuroscience supports the idea that affect is an essential component of good judgment.   Chapter 5, which focuses on the centrality of narrative to the human experience, is rather more speculative, but here too, Thiele calls upon findings in neuroscience to illustrate and support his views about the narrative structure of human moral reasoning.   

A book as ambitious as this one cannot possibly be all things to all people, and thus will inevitably fall short in some of the places where one was hoping to find greater insight.  It would be unreasonable to demand a comprehensive treatment of all the book's themes from all possible angles, and presumably, it isn't Thiele's aim to give such a treatment.   My comments will be aimed at what a philosopher interested in its central questions might draw from it and how it might be useful in furthering the discussion of practical judgment as it is currently proceeding within philosophy.  

Let me begin with the introduction, which, while engaging, is overly dependent on jargon and somewhat muddled about its subject matter.  It isn't until near the end of the introduction that we find out what Thiele has in mind by practical wisdom or practical judgment.  Until that point, it is unclear whether he is intending to discuss specifically moral judgment, practical judgment in general, or something in between.   More seriously, the introduction sets up a framework for his discussion that will likely strike philosophers as outdated or insufficiently nuanced.   Consider this passage:

Moral and political judgments are never uncontestably right or wrong.  They prove difficult to make not simply because they grapple with deep complexity -- that is to say, with diverse, interactive variables -- but because the very determination of ends and means -- as well as the standards by which these ends and means might be evaluated -- remain forever open to dispute.  In moral and political affairs, the "canons of success" one might appropriately employ in assessing and evaluating judgments remain essentially contested (p. 11).

While no philosopher would deny that moral judgments are widely contested, Thiele is passing far too lightly over far too many substantive philosophical issues here.  And it matters, because Thiele routinely makes claims about "good" practical judgment without much awareness of the resulting need to establish standards by which someone's capacity for, or use of, practical judgment can be assessed as good or bad.   He asserts that there can be no experts in practical morality in the way there can be experts in chess, yet he immediately goes on to say that "the most we can aspire to in our moral and political life is proficiency of judgment" (p. 119).  But in the absence of further explanation, which he does not offer, it is hard to see what proficiency might entail other than some sort of expertise.   It is, of course, difficult to be a moral expert (perhaps even impossible), but it doesn't follow that the concept is incoherent.   Indeed, while Thiele is unabashedly Aristotelian throughout the book, he pays little attention to the fact that for Aristotle, the virtue of practical wisdom is inextricably linked to an objective conception of human flourishing.   The book eventually proves to be more concerned with explaining the phenomenon of practical judgment than with justifying it.   There is a point to doing both tasks, but Thiele sometimes appears to mistake the first for the second.   This leads him to make claims like the following: 

For the most part, moral judgment is not a process of deriving imperatives for action from abstract propositions.  Rather, it arises through the internalization of social values and the immediate perception of their violations.  This process takes place without much in the way of recourse to theory (p. 71).

Setting aside the question of whether anyone really thinks that moral judgment is about deriving imperatives for action from abstract propositions, it is unclear what kind of claim the second sentence is supposed to be making.  If it is simply a claim about human psychology, then it may be true, but it does not tell us much about how such judgments might be justified from a moral standpoint.  (Surely, practical wisdom as a virtue requires more than simply the internalization of social values and the ability to determine when they are under threat.)   From a philosophical standpoint, this is a rather serious shortcoming. 

The second chapter, in which Thiele provides an abbreviated history of the philosophical foundations of practical judgment, is probably the most frustrating for a philosopher to read.   On the one hand, it is certainly a valuable contribution to follow the trail of an idea throughout history, particularly since contemporary philosophers can be prone to ignoring important historical connections among ideas.  On the other hand, I am skeptical that the concept of practical judgment is sufficiently similar across all these authors to make the comparison particularly useful.   And while the chapter does show Thiele's truly admirable intellectual range, it also contains enough idiosyncratic interpretations and flat-out mistakes to send up some red flags.   This is most unfortunate; it certainly made it harder for me to take at face value Thiele's accounts of ideas and findings in other disciplines.   The discussion of Aristotle, which is probably the most significant for the rest of the book, shows some confusion about the distinction between moral and intellectual virtues, and the place of phronesis within that structure (p. 22).   Thiele also employs the cardinal virtues as a way of explaining Aristotle's account in the Nichomachean Ethics (p. 20), which unsurprisingly leads to a mischaracterization of phronesis and its relationship to other virtues.   The account of Aquinas -- oddly embedded in the section on Machiavelli -- bears little resemblance to his actual views.  And although the section on Kant shows welcome attention to the Critique of Judgment, the use of Kant throughout the book presents an outdated picture of him as advocating a system of axiomatic moral rules on which all moral judgment should be based.   Thiele himself seems aware that this is a caricature, and yet the book tends to set up reason-obsessed deontologists as the enemy, and Aristotelian practical wisdom, with its reliance on affect and its sensitivity to nuance, as the solution.   But this way of framing the issue has rightly been cast aside by most philosophers working in normative ethics.  

Indeed, one of the primary failures of the book from a philosophical standpoint is its lack of attention to how the debate over practical wisdom has transformed in recent years.  I say this with some hesitation, because I doubt it is entirely fair to expect a non-philosopher to stay current with all the latest philosophical trends.  Even so, it is disappointing to read a book with philosophical ambitions that discusses Aristotelian practical wisdom without any mention of currently important issues, such as moral particularism.  We find Thiele saying things like this:  "Most contemporary scholarship on judgment concerns itself with how we might counteract biases that intrude on rational decision-making" (p. 120).  This has not been true in philosophy for a number of years, if it was ever true at all.   In the end, Thiele's discussion seems unfortunately out of touch with the considerable volume of recent philosophical literature on practical wisdom and practical moral judgment. 

Philosophers who are well-versed in the contemporary philosophical discussions of practical wisdom will not, I fear, find in this book a new way of looking at the debate.  But this is not to say that the book is entirely useless to philosophers.   In Chapters 3, 4, and 5, Thiele covers a wide array of fascinating data from cognitive psychology and neuroscience, all of which is relevant to understanding the virtue of practical wisdom in its embodied form.   Philosophers working in the area will likely be familiar with much of it, but some of it is bound to be new to most readers.  And Thiele does an especially nice job of sorting the research in ways that will be philosophically useful, although he tends to draw unwarranted conclusions from the data.  The philosophical claims in those chapters are not particularly original, but they are well-illustrated, even when not well-supported.  Thiele's discussion of narrative experience in Chapter 5, though repetitive in places, is more perceptive and more detailed than many such discussions in philosophy, and his facility with a wide range of authors and texts is a real advantage in that chapter.  

The book, then, presents philosophers with a mixed bag.   As a whole, it is not an especially novel or useful contribution to the philosophical literature on the subject, and it suffers from some quite serious mistakes.  And yet there are novel and useful bits and pieces scattered throughout.  I suspect, however, that the book will be of more value to those working outside of philosophy than for those already immersed in the philosophical debates on practical judgment.