The Heart of Wisdom: A Philosophy of Spiritual Life

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Richard White, The Heart of Wisdom: A Philosophy of Spiritual Life, Rowman and Littlefield, 2012, 160pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442221161.

Reviewed by Stephen R.L. Clark, University of Bristol


Richard White seeks to show how the practice of philosophy can be a spiritual exercise, and the writings of philosophers be a guide in that endeavour. 'Spiritual concerns', he proposes, are to be defined in opposition to 'material concerns': how much wealth or power we can accumulate. Spirituality has to do instead with those goals and those experiences that may make our lives 'significant', that embody for us something 'sacred'. These are not necessarily either 'religious' (which perhaps here means 'supernatural') or 'moral' values. 'Spirituality' is a matter both of 'a journey toward fulfilment and enlightenment' and 'an encounter with ultimate reality and meaning' (p.2). This may be expressed in metaphysical accounts of Self and its approximation to Reality, even the identity of 'Atman' and 'Brahman', but it may also be treated 'phenomenologically': what is it like to pursue a 'spiritual' quest, and how may the writings and example of 'philosophers' assist us?

Philosophers of late, White says, have mostly forgotten that 'philosophy' within the Classical, the Indian, Chinese and even medieval European tradition was such a spiritual discipline -- not merely an academic subject, still less a set of techniques for winning arguments. He honours Pierre Hadot especially for reminding us that philosophy was 'a way of life', and that philosophers were expected to have higher ideals and manners than an ordinary person. Hadot deserves the honour, but perhaps the message has already been more widely acknowledged than White recognizes. There are many academic and popular writings advancing the cause of a spiritualizing philosophy, ranging from Richard Sorabji's Gifford lectures Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation to Alain de Botton's The Consolations of Philosophy. Several conferences have been held on the topic, often acknowledging Hadot as their inspiration, including a Royal Institute of Philosophy conference in Liverpool back in 1991, whose essays were published as Philosophy, Religion and the Spiritual Life (ed. Michael McGhee, 1992). There has been a rapprochement, for example, between philosophical practice and 'Cognitive Behaviour Therapy', issuing in an international movement for Philosophical Therapy. And even without these events it is hard to read the classics even of early modern philosophy and not realize that more was intended than mere clarity of argument, leaving our everyday lives untouched: witness David Hume, Benedict Spinoza, John Stuart Mill, Charles Sanders Peirce and (twice over) Ludwig Wittgenstein. Even the logical positivists -- perhaps especially they -- were concerned to rid us of superstition, emotional confusion, folly: their discipline was as ascetic and as goal-directed as any older movement, and as paradoxical.

White's frequent appeal is to Stoic, Hindu and Buddhist sources, though he rarely examines individual thinkers of those sorts, but the philosophers he finds most congenial to his purposes are Nietzsche, Derrida, Levinas and Lyotard. Ordinarily 'analytic' philosophers, he supposes, have less to offer us: Iris Murdoch (an Oxford-trained contemporary of Elizabeth Anscombe, Philippa Foot and Mary Midgley -- all dedicated to philosophizing in a way that matters) seems to be the only one worth mentioning. It is not only moderns that White strangely neglects. Aristotle -- though he identified the proper goal of life and of philosophising as 'ton theon therapeuein kai theorein' (Eudemian Ethics 8.1249b20: that is, to love and serve the divine in us and in the world) -- is mentioned chiefly (pp.58-61) as the author of a description, thoroughly off-putting to most modern readers, of the supposed ethical hero, the megalopsuchos. It would be fairer to Aristotle, and to the tradition of which he was a part, to recognize that in this description of a popular idol he was seeking to uncover a deeper meaning, and that the real life-well-lived is in the enjoyment of intellectual beauty, as distant as we can manage from merely bodily or social profit. Platonists, at least as much as Stoics or Epicureans, maintained a philosophical discipline that would be recognized as 'spiritual'. 'Shut your eyes, and change to and wake another way of seeing, which everyone has but few use', so Plotinus (225-270) said, in Ennead I.6 [1].8. That way begins, at least, in dialectic, the careful analysis of argument in companionable discourse.  That is why, Iamblichus of Chalcis (204-325) jokingly remarks, Hermes -- as the god of dialectical argument -- carries a staff with two snakes eyeing each other across the rod: see his Letters (eds., John Dillon and Wolfgang Pelleichtner, 2009: Letter 5).

So White's book is not quite as unusual as he supposes (he is unaware, he says, of 'any systematic discussion of spiritual life from a philosophical standpoint that uses critical reflection to illuminate spiritual ideas' (p.10)), and perhaps neglects too many important thinkers and practitioners. It does, nonetheless, have many merits of its own. White discusses several features of the spiritual life in detail: suffering, compassion, generosity, forgiveness, reverence, joy. We need not accept either Abrahamic (monotheistic) or Nietzschean (atheistic) or even Buddhist metaphysics to appreciate the psychological insights of those traditions, and to pursue a 'spiritual' life with their assistance -- an alternative to yoga, alternative medicine, meditation and prayer (pp.13-14).

Suffering is more than physical or even emotional pain: it is in its extremity our reduction to mere stuff, without power to change or evade what is imposed on us. Without it we could never realize the limitations and dependencies of our individual existence, or have any reason to amend our ways. In suffering we realize our mortality: that is, our death becomes real to us in prospect or imminent event. Levinas provides a fruitful meditation on this experience, and especially on the folly and wickedness involved in seeking to show that such suffering is deserved or even justified. We may nonetheless attempt to find some meaning, some resolution of our anguish, without having to adopt the strict Stoic interpretation (that all things are exactly as they must be, and that we must somehow affirm all things as 'good'). Compassion must be our answer, though White stands aside from Levinas's own insistence that we are each to be held responsible, to hold ourselves responsible, for all. He examines the notion and attempted cultivation of compassion (which is not the same as a condescending 'pity') in Buddhist and Christian texts, and Nietzchean critiques of the notion. Is a universal compassion possible, or even bearable, without -- effectively -- a miraculous inspiration that takes us beyond mere friendship or emotional attachment? How can we bear to mind about a universal suffering? And how -- moving on -- can we possibly 'forgive' those who create such agonies (whether human agents or any imagined supernatural beings)? Must not unconditional forgiveness be impossible? The dead cannot forgive, and the living shouldn't -- but failure to forgive itself begets more pain, more vengeful action and emotion.

And yet 'the underlying goodness of the world forms part of our ordinary experience of it, and it makes us want to go on living' (pp.56-57). That 'goodness' is 'the generosity of life' -- a notion, White says, that is mostly neglected or rejected by philosophers (except for Nietzsche, Heidegger and Derrida). Plotinus and his followers might have provided more resources: for them the incomprehensible beginning ('the One') is evidenced, exactly, in its generosity, as light pours from the sun or perfume from a flower, without diminishing the source. Our aim should be to join or rejoin the dance, by attending to its leader, looking toward the omnipresent source. Our lives and talents are gifts (whether or not there is a conscious giver), and we can transform at least our attitude and response to personal and cosmic pain by practising the art of giving. There are perils in this as an abstract recipe: devoting ourselves to service may be either hypocritical (a subtle way of controlling those we 'serve') or else deeply neurotic (a denial of one's own reality that must be incompatible in the end with any affirmation of another's real being, or with the strength and sense to persevere even in that calling). Simone Weil was either a saint or an anorexic in hoping to efface herself ('when I am anywhere I pollute the silence of earth and sky with my breathing and the beating of my heart', she said in her Notebooks (tr. A.Wills, 1956, vol.2, p.423)): either way she died of it. But a self-effacing generosity of spirit is needed to forgive -- especially when such forgiveness seems irrational or even wrong. There are some acts -- and the Holocaust is only one example -- which seem to demand an absolute and unwavering condemnation: we cannot 'forgive' or be reconciled without any cost with those who did such things, or knowingly permitted them. A more theologically minded author might at this point recall the point of the Atonement: an attempted reconciliation of the absolute demands of Justice and of Mercy. Someone -- God Himself -- has taken on the penalty for sin so that sinners may at last be reconciled. That doctrine, of course, excites considerable scorn among rationalizing moralists -- but the alternatives do seem worse: either there are sinners wholly unreconciled, or we somehow agree to overlook an absolute iniquity, perhaps by treating the Holocaust (for example) as no more than an unintended plague to which we should respond by learning and building from it, without any wish to condemn its agents (something like the Stoic response, and having its own implicit contradictions: if all things are fated, and to be acknowledged as such, how can we be expected to take advice that runs so counter to our impulse to revenge?).

And yet exactly these examples of an absolute iniquity reveal by opposition a further virtue: reverence, as Peter Berger proposed in A Rumor of Angels (1970). White concentrates on 'the idea of reverence for human beings', though he also acknowledges the possibility of reverence for 'nature' and the manifold assembly of those non-human beings with whom we share the world (and on whom we are dependent). 'In reverence I have a sense of something that is greater than I am' (p.97) -- whether that be God, or Truth, or Beauty -- and am at once humbled into a recognition of my own dependence and uplifted by the realization that 'I am in a relationship with something which is exalted and important' (p.97). I may also, of course, feel a corresponding shame that I have failed to live accordingly. White makes particular use of Martin Buber here, in his account of I-You encounters. 'The sacred or the holy', he reports, 'is not elsewhere in some remote beyond' (p.103), but realized here-now in 'the authentic I-You encounter with another person' (why only persons?). Those encounters must be bodily, subject to time and change, and the post-human expectation of our radical restructuring leads only to an 'inhuman' future (so Lyotard proposed). Christian theologians might at this point speak of a desired event, 'the resurrection of the body'. White prefers to slip aside from Lyotard's glum prophecies to speak of Joy, as the culmination of a spiritual and philosophical endeavour. In this concluding chapter he brings together Rousseau, the Stoics, Nietzsche and the Upanishads to speak of an 'underlying reality' identical with our most serious self. We cannot simply 'choose' to feel joyful, but perhaps a philosophical discipline of the sort that Classical and Indian philosophers all advocated and advanced might make it possible that Joy somehow descends.

In brief, there is much to learn from White's brief survey of a possible route from suffering to joy, and its intellectual and practical difficulties. It is a valuable addition to contemporary explorations of Philosophy as a Spiritual Path, even if -- as I suppose -- he has neglected much in the tradition and current practice even of analytical philosophy, and of theology.