The Hebrew Republic: Jewish Sources and the Transformation of European Political Thought

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Eric Nelson, The Hebrew Republic: Jewish Sources and the Transformation of European Political Thought, Harvard University Press, 2010, 229pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674050587.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Melamed, Johns Hopkins University


Over the past few years there has been an increased interest in what came to be called the "Hebrew Political Tradition," though unfortunately this emerging field has been infected by ideological motivation and uneven scholarship. The very title of "Hebrew" rather than "Jewish" political tradition is an attempt to invoke a fantasized political realm that belongs to a "pre-exilic" Judaism that has little to do with historical reality and much to do with the religious and national imagination. The current book is a careful study of the early modern fantasy about the "Hebrew Republic." It is a highly erudite and well-written work, which for the most part succeeds in navigating away from the temptations of gross ideology. Eric Nelson's book comes in the wake of several recent, grand attempts to present the emergence of modernity and modern political thought as the victory of secularism over the forces of darkness. Against this ideological secularism, Nelson argues, rightly to my mind, that some key elements of modern political thought were motivated by religious convictions and beliefs.

According to the author, political theorists of the sixteenth and seventeenth century, unlike their Renaissance predecessors, did not adhere to the pagan inheritance of Greece and Rome as their major source of inspiration, but rather considered the Hebrew Bible and Rabbinic literature as providing the model of an ideal, divinely ordained, state. In the three chapters of this short book, Nelson attempts to show how the early moderns relied on Jewish sources in introducing and defending three main elements of modern political thought: republican exclusivism (i.e., the rejection of monarchy), redistribution of wealth, and religious toleration. This perception of the Hebrew Bible, claims Nelson, gradually disappeared in the eighteenth century. "Where so many seventeenth-century readers had found toleration, republican liberty, and a care for equality, the gens de lettres of the eighteenth century tended to detect only barbarity, despotic legalism, and a chauvinistic particularity" (139). Yet, claims Nelson: "it would be an unfortunate error to project the philosophes' understanding of the Hebrew Bible back into the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries" (139). Nelson's main claims are surprising and bold and initially left me quite skeptical, yet he succeeds in marshalling a considerable body of evidence, which, though not conclusive, still presents early modern political thought in an interesting and unfamiliar light and calls for further studies of the issue.

The book begins with a survey of Renaissance and early modern Hebraism -- the Christian West's "discovery" and translation of Rabbinic literature, advanced by figures such as Erasmus, Reuchlin, Sixtinus Amama, Sebastian Münster, the Buxtorfs, Joseph Justus Scaliger, and John Selden. It then turns to its first topic: republican exclusivism. According to the author, monarchy had been uniformly considered as at least one of the legitimate forms of government until the beginning of the seventeenth century. Yet by the end of the same century there appears a clear voice that rejects monarchism as strictly illegitimate. In the first chapter of the book, Nelson argues that the best explanation for the emergence of republican exclusivism lies in the contemporary discovery of the Hebrew Bible and Rabbinic sources which disqualify monarchy as a form of idolatry. Indeed, the passage in I Sam. 8:4-9 describing the circumstances of the divine election of Saul, the first Hebrew king, makes clear that the Israelites' pledge to the prophet Samuel ("make us a king to judge us like all the nations" [8:5]) was conceived by God and Samuel as a betrayal in the kingdom of God, who consoles Samuel: "they have not rejected thee, but they have rejected me, that I should not reign over them" (8:7). Indeed, in many classical Jewish sources, dominion by God and dominion by man are taken as mutually exclusive. (This is, for example, the Bible's main objection to the enslavement of Hebrews. See Leviticus 25:55.) Nelson points out a few Talmudic and Midrashic debates about the legitimacy of monarchy, and he nicely documents the use of these newly available sources by seventeenth-century proponents and critics of monarchy in both England and the Continent.

Nelson's second chapter attempts to detect another important development in the history of political thought: the introduction of redistribution into the mainstream of republican political theory. According to the author, until the early seventeenth century, early modern political theorists followed the denunciation of land redistribution that was consistently dominant in Roman sources. Here again, Nelson suggests that the major shift in the thought of republican theorists was inspired by the biblical law of the Jubilee: the return of lands to their original owners every fifty years (Lev. 25: 13-24). Nelson documents the appeal to Biblical law, Rabbinic commentaries on the Bible, and Maimonides' discussion of the Jubilee in his legal code, in the justification of agrarian redistribution by authors such as Petrus Cunaeus and James Harrington. He suggests that these were the newly discovered Hebrew sources that "opened up a third way" in modern republican thought, one that "embraces neither the protection nor the abolition of private property, but rather its redistribution" (86).

In the third, final, and longest chapter of the book -- "Hebrew Theocracy and the Rise of Toleration" -- Nelson argues that the imagined respublica Hebraeorum was a main source of inspiration for early modern supporters of religious toleration and Erastianism. This was the view associated with the Zwinglian Swiss theologian, Erastus (Thomas Lüber), who advocated, on religious grounds, that the civil magistrate is the only possible source of valid religious law. Nelson shows convincingly the repeated appeals by proponents of religious toleration to tolerant elements in Rabbinic law, such as the view that acceptance of Judaism is not "the only way to salvation" (i.e., that Gentiles also have a share in the world to come). Nelson also shows that Erastus himself considered the ancient Jewish state as a political model, maintaining that "the Church is most worthily and wisely ordered, which cometh nearest to the constitution of the Jewish Church" (92).

Yet, the main Jewish source that is brought in to attest to the Erastian nature of the ancient Jewish state is Josephus, and this is not by coincidence. Anyone familiar with Rabbinic literature can not help but be surprised by the ascription of Erastianism to this culture. While Rabbinic literature is typically highly polyphonic -- leaving few, if any, issues unchallenged -- it is hard to find a Rabbinic source supporting the intervention of secular authorities (Jewish or Gentile) in Rabbinic matters. Just to briefly illustrate this issue let me point out that while in normal circumstances Rabbinic law allows (in fact, requires) a person to transgress almost all commandments in order to save lives, at a time of an attempt by external authorities to intervene forcefully against religious law, the Talmud rules that one is required to sacrifice one's life even on petty issues such as the proper manner of tying shoes (BT Sanhederin 74:2). Similarly, Rabbinic sources (as well as the Bible's prophets) rarely shy away from describing kings and sovereigns as wicked. While Nelson documents early modern Hebraists who took the Great Sanhedrin (the ancient highest Rabbinic court) as a civil organ, this is very far from the view of this body by Rabbinic writers themselves. This brings us to the important question of the precise nature of the encounter that occurred between Christian Hebraists and "Rabbinic literature" on the eve of modernity.

The training and initiation of a serious scholar in a traditional Rabbinic setting is long and trying: ten to fifteen years of rigorous daily study (fourteen hours a day) of Talmudic hermeneutics and conceptual analysis.[1] The initiated scholars sometimes, but not always, produced written work. This was usually written in a dense and abbreviated form (a typical page of Rabbinic novellæ could contain several dozens of nuanced arguments). As a result this literature is utterly opaque to outsiders. The vast majority of Jews whose native language was Hebrew could hardly decipher a single line in the main Rabbinic novellæ on Talmudic treatises. Indeed, this body of literature, which one may call "High Rabbinics," presents an insurmountable challenge to current academic scholars of Rabbinic literature (unless of course they gained serious and sustained traditional training before turning to the academy).

For these reasons I do not share Nelson's appreciation for the Rabbinic erudition of the early modern Hebraists. Looking carefully at the list of the Rabbinic sources translated by the Hebraists (summarized by Nelson on page 15) leaves little room for a conclusion other than that the newly available texts were barely the tip of the iceberg of Rabbinic literature, in fact nothing over and above rudimentary sources that an average twelve-year-old child in a traditional setting was expected to master (with the exception of Kabbalistic literature, the study of which was commonly restricted to adults). Thus, for example, the RASHBA (Rabbi Shlomo ben Avraham ben Adrat, 1235-1310), one of, if not the, most important, influential, and original Rabbinic political thinkers, is simply absent from Nelson's book and the early modern sources he cites. Along similar lines one may wonder at Nelson's attempt to gauge the linguistic skills of the Hebraists (17-19), since knowledge of Hebrew cannot safeguard accessibility to Rabbinic thought any more than knowledge of Dutch shows one's ability to engage seriously with Brouwer's intuitionism. Indeed, in all three issues discussed by Nelson, the early modern Hebraist sources he cites barely scratch the surface of the Rabbinic discussions.

Nelson's book is, to my mind, an important and pioneering contribution to the study of modern political theory, though I would hesitate to suggest that Rabbinic texts were the actual sources of the three doctrines discussed in the book. Arguably, the reconstructed early modern European fantasies about the nature of the ancient Hebrew Republic, rather than the actual Rabbinic works, were the sources motivating the changes traced by Nelson. Finally, let me stress that modern Europeans appealed to the authority of the Hebrew Bible (and Rabbinic sources) not only to motivate the more progressive aspects of the modern polity, but also such horrific phenomena as racism, the enslavement of the "Sons of Ham," and even genocide. In fairness, "the Rabbis" should not bear much responsibility for the deeds of Europe, either good or bad.

[1] On the education of Rabbinic scholars, see Elhanan Reiner, "Capital, Social Strata and the Study of Torah: The Kloiz in the Jewish Society in Eastern Europe in the Seventeenth and Eighteenth Centuries," Zion 98 (1993), 287-328, and David Katz, A Case Study in the Formation of a Rabbi: The Early Years of Rabbi Ezekiel Landau, 1713-1754 (University of Maryland Dissertation, 2004).