The Heidegger Dictionary

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Daniel O. Dahlstrom, The Heidegger Dictionary, Bloomsbury, 2013, 312pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847065148.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


The Bloomsbury series of philosophy dictionaries, which already includes volumes on Husserl, Gadamer, Derrida, Hegel, and Sartre, among others, aims at offering easy and efficient reference tools to readers who want quick access and reliable information on specific aspects, topics or themes, pertaining to an author. Daniel Dahlstrom’s The Heidegger Dictionary fulfills this task extremely well. The dictionary consists of a three-page foreword explaining how the dictionary is structured, an eight-page introduction presenting Heidegger’s life and thought, and two parts. In the first main part (the first 231 pages) we have a gloss, description and explanation of 162 key terms and key figures in Heidegger’s thought. The entries here include the English term or expression with the German word in parenthesis, and the variant translations whenever they exist. They vary in length, from half a page to several pages depending on the importance of the term or figure in question. The second and shorter part (45 pages) reviews the sixty-six volumes of Heidegger’s complete works already published by providing usually half a page but sometimes a longer description for each volume. The section ends with a list of the announced volumes set for publication and current English translations. A glossary of German terms with their English translation as well as an index follow.

All these entries, whether they concern topics (such as care) or themes (such as ethics) figures (such as Schelling) or works, are extremely well cross-referenced, making this dictionary a user-friendly tool as well as a compact comprehensive overview of the breadth and development of Heidegger’s thought. Dahlstrom puts all his research and scholarship to excellent use in selecting the key terms, the topics, and the themes of this dictionary as well as in framing the issue and structuring the presentation. It is a remarkable achievement to be able to provide for each entry an overview of how a certain notion has evolved in Heidegger’s thinking, what its different aspects are, and how specific works have reshaped it. The entry also includes references to specific works and often some direct quotations. While most entries are topics or themes Heidegger himself chose or formulated, some of them, such as the Rectoral Address, are milestones in his career, although not necessarily viewed as such by him.

Putting together such a dictionary for any philosopher is quite a difficult task. The author of the dictionary needs to be deeply knowledgeable of the texts and possess a firm grasp of all the aspects of the philosopher’s thought. It is also a hermeneutically risky enterprise -- the author needs to decide on the relevance of the themes and topics as well as the amount of discussion they merit. This is all the more difficult and daring in the case of Heidegger, who has been controversial both as an individual and as a philosopher. These controversial aspects of Heidegger’s thought have generated quite a series of polemics from philosophers and journalists alike, and they have given rise to many different frameworks of interpretation as well as many different and incompatible perspectives.

Dahlstrom manages to take an interpretive stance that remains above the fray by acknowledging these differing interpretations or critiques and by opting for a level of description that strikes the right balance between generality and specificity. His descriptions are general enough to avoid any strong hermeneutical stance or any special allegiance to a school of thought. They are specific enough to provide assistance to both non-specialists and Heidegger scholars. Dahlstrom manages this fine hermeneutic balance by treating each of the entries as a sample taken from the thickness of Heidegger’s thought that reveals the different layers of his thinking, the chronology of how his views have evolved, and the importance the topic under consideration has had at particular periods of time. For example, the entry “Appropriating event (Ereignis)” explains how the notion includes both an element of coming to one’s own, an element of event, and an element of history. The entry indicates some of the variations the term has undergone in Heidegger’s thought and explains what role it is supposed to play in various periods of Heidegger’s reflection. Each entry is thus a kind of cross-section of the soil of Heidegger’s thought, bringing to the fore a stratified picture of his thought as a whole. Although readers are not expected to read this dictionary from beginning to end, doing so yields an interesting and alternative overview of Heidegger’s thought by means of overlapping themes and topics instead of through a linear presentation of his evolving views.

To take another example, in the entry aletheia Dahlstrom reminds us of the original meaning in Homer and Plato, Heidegger’s re-interpretation as a privation of hiddenness, the positive sense of this privation -- if there is a hiddenness of things it is for someone -- and how aletheia is understood as the truth of being in the sense of the truth that being is. Dahlstrom then shows how the Latin translation of aletheia as veritas loses the link to hiddenness and refers instead to the correctness of statements. This shows retrospectively that aletheia originally could be neither the mere correctness of what is said nor the mere fact that beings are hidden. He then links the interplay of concealing and unconcealing to what “The Origin of the Work of Art” calls the strife between earth and world. In passing, he also mentions some critics of Heidegger’s understanding of truth, such as Jaspers or Tugendhat, and shows how the notion of aletheia evolves after Being and Time.

Aside from these themes and topics, the first part of the dictionary also includes key figures, philosophers and poets, who have all played a significant role in Heidegger’s thought. For each of these figures, Dahlstrom presents the role they played in Heidegger’s thinking, the overall place they occupied in the corpus of his work, and the significance they had with respect to specific topics or themes. This part will help researchers find out immediately when Heidegger studied a specific author, in which works, and what role this philosopher or poet played in his thought. For example, the entry “Rilke, Rainer Maria (1875-1926)” begins with a list of the poet’s main works before showing how Heidegger uses Rilke to explain how his own thinking moves away from the modern understanding of the subject and being. Finally, the entry lists several themes in Rilke that Heidegger uses and shows how Heidegger distinguishes his own conception of the Open from Rilke’s notion.

The second, shorter, part is a brief description of the sixty-six volumes published so far in the Complete Works (Gesamtausgabe). Each entry, usually around half a page in length but sometimes more, offers a description that summarizes the work and lists the main themes. This gives the reader a good idea of how the work is structured, what the topic is, and how the development of Heidegger’s thought took place.

Overall, what the dictionary reveals, in addition to the breadth of Heidegger’s thought and the magnitude of what it addresses, is the fascinating suppleness of his thinking. With Dahlstrom’s elucidations, Heidegger is shown to offer different and coherent variations on the same themes in the course of his career.

In addition to the The Heidegger Concordance, also published by Bloomsbury, we now have in this dictionary a new and handy research tool that is limited in its scope but very focused in making available to readers a quick overview of key topics in Heidegger’s thought, key figures that have played a significant role in Heidegger’s thinking, as well as a brief summary of Heidegger’s works. Since all works of this type require significant hermeneutic choices, there may be quibbles about one particular entry receiving too much or too little attention, or about a figure who has been overlooked. However, the generally well-balanced approach Dahlstrom takes, the strength of his scholarship, and the breadth of his knowledge of the texts, makes any quibble of this sort a secondary, if not irrelevant, concern given the wealth of information that is given in such a succinct and clear presentation.