The Heirs of Plato: A Study of the Old Academy (347-274 BC)

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John Dillon, The Heirs of Plato: A Study of the Old Academy (347-274 BC), Oxford, 2003, 264pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198237669.

Reviewed by Voula Tsouna, University of California, Santa Barbara


When Plato died in 347 BC, he bequeathed to his devoted disciples both a physical location in which philosophy was practised in a more or less organised manner and an intellectual legacy of extraordinary originality and richness. It comprised philosophical writings ’the like of which had never been seen before or since’ (v), a number of methods of enquiry aiming at truth and, as John Dillon contends on the basis of Aristotle’s evidence, an oral tradition of metaphysical, ethical, and logical doctrines. According to Dillon, these doctrines represent Plato’s most serious speculations, which are often alluded to but never straightforwardly advanced in his later dialogues (17). They reflect the philosophical possibilities that Plato found in Pythagoreanism, postulating as they do a mathematical model for the structure of reality which has also ethical and logical counterparts. The main purpose of Dillon’s book is to examine just how members of the Old Academy interpreted, modified, or developed that model. They include both Plato’s immediate successors to the headship of the Academy, namely his nephew Speusippus of Athens (head 347-339 BC: Chapter Two), Xenocrates of Chalcedon (339-314 BC: Chapter Three), Polemo of Athens (314-276 BC: Chapter Four), and minor figures such as Philippus of Opus, Hermodorus of Syracuse, Heraclides of Pontus, and Crantor of Soli (Chapter Five).

At the outset, I should like to draw attention to three distinctive features of Dillon’s account. First, as the author himself points out (1), it depends heavily on the assumption that one can and should go beyond Plato’s dialogues to whatever evidence is available about Plato’s later doctrines. Therefore, Dillon’s reconstructions inevitably involve a great deal of imagination and speculation on his side and an open mind on ours. Second, Dillon’s reliance on secondary sources is combined, successfully, with constant references to Plato’s late dialogues and gains plausibility for precisely that reason. Third, his study of the figures of the Old Academy is both biographical and systematic. Aside from its obvious historical benefits, such an approach has the additional advantages that it brings to life each philosopher individually and that it recreates something of the intellectual ambiance pervading the institution as a whole. However, considerations of space oblige me to focus exclusively on philosophical aspects of Dillon’s book, in particular on metaphysical and cosmological matters; on the other hand, I shall not cover the logical, ethical, and other doctrines of the Old Academy. Much of what I shall say is expository and explanatory. Although I shall occasionally make critical comments, my main purposes will be to supply the readers with an overview of material which is relatively little known, and to highlight Dillon’s argument in several places.

First, we should look at the doctrines that Dillon attributes to Plato (16-29). Influenced by Pythagoreanism, Plato construed a system which postulates a pair of opposed first principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad (which he called, it seems, ’the great-and-small’ or ’the greater-and-smaller’), and a division into three levels of being (18). From the action of the One upon the Dyad, there derives a set of Forms conceived as mathematical entities of some sort, the so-called Form-Numbers. Of these special importance is attributed to the primal numbers, one, two, three, and four, (the tetraktys), and also to their sum total, ten (the Decad). The primal numbers act upon the Dyad with the result that all other natural numbers are generated (19). On Dillon’s view, the Forms are these secondary combinations which are dependent on the primal numbers comprising the Decad (21).

Although it remains uncertain just how many the Forms are, it is reasonably clear that Plato envisages some hierarchical arrangement according to which the primal numbers occupy a privileged position. In any event, the four numbers that comprise the tetractys play an important role in Plato’s cosmology, since they provide some kind of link between the absolute unity of the One and the multiplicity of the physical world. The first four numbers have a geometrical aspect: One is also the Point, Two the Line, Three the Plane represented by the triangle, and Four the Solid represented by the pyramid (21). Recalling the Soul in the Timaeus in that connection (22), Dillon completes Plato’s model as follows. From the Soul dimensions are projected onto Matter as combinations of basic triangles. Thus are formed the four elements (Fire, Air, Water, Earth) and, ultimately, all physical beings (22).

Further investigation of the doctrine of the Soul yields an interpretation concerning Aristotle’s claim that, besides the Forms which are each of one kind and cannot be combined, Plato postulated the existence of ’mathematicals’ which are, on the one hand, many, the same and combinable and, on the other hand, eternal and immaterial (22-23). Using late evidence from Iamblichus and Proclus (cf. 23, n.45) and with the Timaeus in hand, Dillon concludes that Plato held that the mathematicals are specifically related to the World-Soul and the generation of sensible objects. Namely, the Soul ’receives the Forms into itself, and somehow transforms them into mathematicals, then projecting them upon Matter to form the physical world’ (23). Hence, the Soul can be seen as a mediator between the intelligible and the sensible realms: influences from the intelligible realm are passed on, extended and multiplied, in order to create the sensible world (24).

For present purposes, I shall concede the overall plausibility of Dillon’s interpretation outlined above. It is worth pointing out, however, that the author’s strategy leaves us in no doubt that the Timaeus, one of those ’written remains’ which ’were for Plato only “entertainments”’ (17), is at least as crucial as Aristotle’s evidence in order to retrieve Plato’s later doctrines. In any case, Plato’s model leaves underdetermined several important issues and faces serious challenges. Notably, how are we to explain the fact that undifferentiated first principles produce a whole series of levels of being? By what mechanism does this happen? How are we to solve problems of diversity and hierarchy concerning Plato’s later theory of Forms? If we do away with the Forms, can we still preserve somehow a creative, demiurgic activity in the universe? Additional issues concern the interpretation of the doctrines presented in the Timaeus, to which it would seem that the dialogue does not provide a definitive solution (24). Notably, is the demiurgic account to be taken literally or metaphorically? Does the world have a temporal beginning? What is the identity of the Demiurge? In what precisely does consist the activity assigned to the ’receptacle’? In what manner do immaterial triangles generate material objects? And how are these triangles related to the Forms? Such questions set a great part of the agenda for the physics and metaphysics of the Old Academy. They constitute the core of a truly open-ended tradition in which each of Plato’s immediate successors makes his own distinct contributions. As we shall see, often these contributions are both philosophically shrewd and historically influential, notwithstanding Aristotle’s low opinion of them.

Speusippus, an enthusiastic Pythagorean and a key figure in the Academy long before Plato’s death, was a fairly prolific writer whose oeuvre, however, is mostly lost. Dillon’s reconstruction of his metaphysical doctrines is based largely on Aristotle’s criticisms of these doctrines, and also on the remains of Speusippus’ treatise On Pythagorean Numbers (OPN) and on Iamblichus’ De communi mathematica scientia IV (DCMS) which, according to Dillon (41, n.28), conveys the substance of Speusippus’ views. Dillon makes the most attractive case to date for the contention that these amount to a coherent theory which deals successfully with some of the objections against Plato’s late doctrines (42-64). Comparably to Plato, Speusippus stipulates two opposite principles, the One and plethos, a principle of indefinite multiplicity. Moreover, he argues that the One is a perfectly simple and entirely transcendent principle. For what is itself the cause of some quality in other things cannot have that quality in the same way; so, if the One is the cause of goodness and being for everything else, it cannot be called itself good or even existent (42). On this picture, then, the supreme One, Unity, ’which one should not even call Being (on)’ and which is the first principle of all things, occupies the first level of Speusippus’ metaphysical scale (51). Combined with multiplicity, it produces a secondary One or Unit, which couples in its turn with multiplicity and generates Number. Also, in some way not clear from the evidence, the union of Number and Multiplicity generates the first principle of Figure. Next, the union of Number and multiplicity produces the first odd number, i.e. the mathematical ’one’, followed by the whole range of natural numbers. The union of Figure with a corresponding form of multiplicity generates all geometrical entities. On the basis of DCMS, Dillon suggests that ’there is also produced an essential geometrical entity which, once again, unites with the principle of Multiplicity to serve as the first principle of the realm of the Soul’ (45), and he adduces Speusippus’ definition of the Soul as ’the form of the omni-dimensionally extended’ (ibid.). The fourth and the fifth levels of existence, which Dillon plausibly identifies as animate and as inanimate physical beings (54-55), seem to be derived in a similar manner. Assuming that the Soul occupies the third level (on the grounds that pure Soul cannot be ’combined by the lowest elements, although embodied souls may’: 54), it couples with Multiplicity to produce both individual embodied souls and a lower formal principle--something like Plotinus’ Nature (55). This in turn, together with Multiplicity, generates the inanimate objects (56).

Some parts of the above scenario are controversial, others unclear, yet others insufficiently supported by evidence. However, Dillon’s story has several virtues, notably the following. It implies that Speusippus draws a clear distinction between the primal One which is the first principle of all things, the secondary one which serves as the first principle for Number, and the mathematical ’one’ which Speusippus regarded (in contrast to earlier views) as the first odd number--a distinction often missed in both ancient and modern scholarship. Also, Speusippus specifies the process by which a whole series of levels of reality are produced: the first product of the union between two principles becomes in its turn a principle ’mating with its mother’ (46) and generating the next level of being. In this way, there is some kind of metaphysical continuity between each level and the next (47). Furthermore, Dillon’s story highlights Speusippus’ way of rationalising and restructuring Plato’s Forms (48-54). Although he abandons the theory of Forms as such, he preserves a paradigmatic and creative function in the universe at the level of the World-Soul, which he considers the transmitter of form to the physical world (51). The enormous influence of the Timaeus is everywhere apparent, notably in Speusippus’ definition of the Soul as ’the form of the omni-dimensionally extended’. By manifesting themselves only at that level, the Forms constitute, precisely, the three-dimensionality characterising the physical world. Dillon’s detailed discussion of this point is, indeed, very valuable. Equally informative is his analysis of Speusippus’ claim that goodness manifests itself only at the level of Soul (53), Speusippus’ probable interpretation of the relation between the first and the second hypotheses in the Parmenides (56-59), and his theory of mathematics emerging from OPN.

We turn now to Xenocrates. A metic from Chalcedon on the Hellespont, a pupil of Plato ’from a youth’ (90), he was elected by a narrow vote to the headship of the Academy in 339 BC. Although only a few lines of his oeuvre survive, there is good evidence that the main purpose of his many works was to systematize the teachings of Plato. In effect, he founded ’Platonism’ as a formalized, and even ossified, body of doctrines, which exercised a far-ranging influence both inside and outside the Academy. He pursued this task with the determination of a dry and scholastic temperament, and in a spirit influenced by both Pythagoreanism and Orphism. Like his predecessors, then, Xenocrates posits two first principles, the Monad (which later evidence identifies as Intellect and God) and the Dyad (determined as the principle of multiplicity and unlimitedness, ’the Everflowing’: 100). As divine Intellect, the Monad contains the totality of number symbolized by the tetraktys (101) and represents the active, male principle whose contents are the Forms. On the other hand, ’the Everflowing’ is the passive, female, material principle. The third form of being, produced by those two, is Number. To this is added Sameness and Otherness and thus derives the Soul, ’number moving itself’, i.e. an entity endowed with mobility and motivity, capable of creating individuals and of individuating them from one another (122).

If one accepts that this account is a plausible interpretation of the Timaeus, one must endorse a non-literal reading of Plato’s dialogue, as Xenocrates does. In any event, for Xenocrates (as for Speusippus) the Soul is immortal, and it is the mediator between the intelligible and the sensible worlds, containing within itself elements which belong to both these realms. In order to fill the picture, Dillon proposes an ingenious if too speculative supplementation of Aetius’ testimony concerning Xenocrates’ theology (102), and he defends it at various points on both etymological and Orphic grounds (104-107). According to Dillon’s supplementation, Xenocrates maintains that the World-Soul, symbolised in Aetius’ text by Athena, receives the Forms as quasi-mathematical entities from the mind of God and projects them onto the sensible world. To understand his position fully, we need to examine the nature of the Forms. For Xenocrates, Forms are Numbers. But since Forms are not combinable, they cannot be handled as mathematical numbers, e.g., in processes of addition and multiplication. Further, they cannot be used as such to explain the move from one level of reality to the next. Xenocrates attempts to solve that problem by postulating that each number of the tetraktys (the active counterpart to the ’Everflowing’) does double duty: it serves both as the foundation of natural numbers and as a Form, namely, two stands as Form of Line, three of Plane, and four of Solid (111-112). Every spatial magnitude is ultimately founded on indivisible minima: every line is constructed by minimal lines, every plane by minimal planes, etc.

One important upshot of this thesis is that it posits indivisible minima in both the intelligible and the sensible realms. Regarding the latter, Dillon plausibly suggests that, by postulating Forms of species as well as elementary material particles, Xenocrates develops the atomistic implications of the theory of basic triangles in the Timaeus (117). Moreover, I concur with Dillon’s remark that Xenocrates’ atomism, also attested in his theory of sound and vision, remains faithful to Plato’s spirit so long as it leaves room for a purposeful universe. On the other hand, I am doubtful concerning Dillon’s claim that Xenocrates’ definition of a Form as ’the paradigmatic cause of whatever is at any time (aei) composed according to nature’ means simply ’things properly formed’, and hence allows for Forms of things contrary to nature (119). For Xenocrates’ definition states plainly the opposite, and aei emphasises, precisely, ’according to nature’. If so, the range of Forms does not cover monsters, freaks, evils, etc., although it may perhaps cover artcrafts. Note that later Platonists took the definition in that sense, i.e. as restricting the range of Forms.

So far, there has been mention of two levels of reality, intelligible and sensible, to which Xenocrates (following Plato) attaches respectively two forms of cognition, episteme and aisthesis. Unlike Plato, however, Xenocrates posits the heavenly realm as a third level, which is composite for the reason that although its contents are sensible, they can be truly known only intellectually through doxa (124-125). In fact, Theophrastus attributes to Xenocrates the allegedly Platonic concept of ’mathematicals’, precisely because he considers the concept applicable to Xenocrates’ intermediate realm (125). Anyway, Xenocrates applies his triadic structure to other contexts as well. In the physical world, he distinguishes between three degrees of tension or density producing three levels of reality, of which the moon occupies the middle ground (125-128). Linked somehow to the moon are the daemons who, in his daemonology, constitute a mixed kind of entity and stand in the intermediate position between gods and men (129). In all these cases, the different levels are interrelated, and they are bound together by the median level or by the entities that occupy it. Xenocrates’ mathematical model testifies to his desire to formalize all levels of reality and to work out their mutual relations (131). Besides, the role that he ascribes to the intermediate position also reflects, I think, deeper intuitions concerning the benevolent operations of the divine Intellect to ensure the perfect order and unity of a multi-layered world.

There is relatively little evidence for the doctrines of Polemo, scholarch of the Academy for nearly forty years. Revered for his ethical theory and praxis (160-166), he seems to have held distinct metaphysical views, which Dillon makes a valiant attempt to retrieve and to interpret as anticipatory of the Stoic system. Fundamental to his approach is the hypothesis that the Academic doctrine presented in Cicero’s Academica broadly reflects Polemo’s position (176-177). This implies a more or less radical rejection of the assumption that Antiochus retrojects Stoic positions and concepts into his own presentation of the Academic viewpoint. Dillon takes over that view from David Sedley, who has argued forcefully for it. However, I am reluctant to accept it in its strongest form. For while I am persuaded that Antiochus’ doctrine is compatible with that of the Old Academy, no definitive argument has been offered supporting the contention that Antiochus’ system is derived exclusively from Academic quarters and contains no Stoic retrojections. Also, even if one concedes that Antiochus’ doctrine is purely Academic, one cannot always distinguish Polemo’s views from those of Xenocrates and of other Academics. Besides, although it is true that Polemo was perceived as a bridge-figure between Platonism and Stoicism and was widely respected for that reason (177), it does not follow that the origin of Antiochus’ doctrines can be traced back to Polemo alone. For instance, Polemo could be the originator of the views propounded by Antiochus or, alternatively, Polemo could have defended successfully over a long period of time and from a position of authority doctrines whose substance was bequeathed to him by his predecessors. But in either case, we have good reason to consider Polemo a key figure in the revival of Platonism in the first century BC. Finally, I feel some unease about Dillon’s way of tracing Zeno’s Stoicism back to the Academy, for it might leave the impression that Zeno’s doctrine was not particularly original either in metaphysics (e.g., 167-168, 169) or in ethics (160, 164-165, 166). I consider Zeno’s Stoicism not so much a cluster of views that he took from Polemo, Xenocrates, Plato, or Heraclitus (167-168), as a strikingly novel philosophical system developed against the background of a complex philosophical tradition of which Platonism constitutes a very important part.

With these remarks in mind let me now turn to the actual doctrines that Dillon attributes to Polemo. Aetius attests that ’Polemo declared that the cosmos is God’ (166), and it seems reasonable to interpret that statement as a manifestation of the general Academic tendency to identify God with a rational World-Soul which, however, is not transcendent over the physical universe but immanent within it (ibid.). The parallel with the Stoic God, also based on Aetius’ testimony (167) is informative, for there too God is intelligent and immanent in the world as a breath pervading it. One the other hand, Dillon claims that ’if one subtracts [from Aetius’ passage] the description of God as fire or pneuma, and the reference to spermatikoi logoi and fate’, the Stoic view described in that passage appears perfectly compatible with that of Polemo. But it is not a small matter to subtract those concepts from the Stoic view, and if one does not, the parallel with the Old Academy becomes less close than Dillon implies.

Next, Antiochus’ version of the Academic treatment of ’the topic of Nature’ (Acad. I.24-29), which Dillon attributes to Polemo, postulates two principles, the one active and creative with power (vis) inherent in it, the other passive and infinitely malleable and consisting of some sort of matter (168-169). Here, matter is entirely formless and quality-less and, therefore, capable of every transformation and infinite division into its own parts (171). No portion of matter and no body exist outside the single eternal world, held together by a sentient nature and pervaded by the active principle, which is explicitly identified as a rational World-Soul. The active principle is also described as perfect intelligence and wisdom, God, a sort of providence, and necessity (anangke) ’because nothing can happen otherwise than has been ordained by it’ (Acad. I.29). As Dillon points out, the distinctly Stoic concepts of the first principle as pure fire and of cosmic conflagration are absent from Cicero’s passage (173). As to the brief mention of necessity, I find convincing the suggestion that anangke does not evoke Stoic determinism but rather the benevolent providence of the World-Soul (173-174). If so, there is ample warrant for such a doctrine within the Academic tradition, and Dillon’s discussion of the Timaeus (especially 46d-48a) goes far towards establishing that point.

Variations and developments of the above doctrines are also found among the minor figures of the Old Academy, who span chronologically from the generation after Plato to that of Polemo. Dillon’s scholarship and synthetic skills are again at play in his account of the remnants of those doctrines. Although I cannot discuss them here, I wish to give a few examples. Philippus of Opus, editor of Plato’s Laws and probably author of the pseudo-Platonic Epinomis, attempts in the latter work to specify the kind of knowledge that the members of the Nocturnal Council must acquire ’in order to be wise’, and he provides theological grounds for that knowledge (183). Approximately fifty years before Polemo, Phillipus too posits as the supreme active principle a rational Soul which is not transcendent but inheres in the celestial realm, is a thoroughly benevolent agent procuring all good things and notably number and reasoning (185), and creates all the classes of beings inhabiting a five-level and five-element universe (183-188). Comparably to Xenocrates, this philosopher ascribes to daemons a median position in the universe and a mediating role between gods and men (193-195). Dillon finds the origins of these doctrines in the Symposium and the Laws. However, although the comparison with the Soul in Plato’s Laws (189-193) is particularly illuminating, it fails to explain, I think, the apparently inconsistent views that the Soul has a genesis (892a) and that the Soul is itself the prote genesis of all things (899c-d).

A different conception of the Soul is defended by Heraclides of Pontus, Plato’s appointee as the supervisor of the Academy in the early 360s and a member of the physicist (as opposed to the mathematical) wing of the school. He views the Soul as a quasi-material entity composed of light or aether, located in space, immortal, and going through circles of reincarnation when embodied (212). Both this doctrine and his physical and cosmological beliefs can be traced back to Plato. In particular, Dillon argues persuasively that Heraclides’ tripartite division of the cosmos is inspired by the myth of Er (213); his claim that the earth rotates about its axis while the heavens remain fixed is an elucidation of Timaeus, 40b8-c1 (214-215); his atomism reflects the concept of molecular bodies in the Timaeus; and like Xenocrates’ atomism, it is fully compatible with Plato’s teachings, since it does not entail Democritus’ mechanistic view of the universe (209-210). Hermodorus of Syracuse, allegedly the composer of a book about Plato and the unauthorized salesman of Plato’s works (198), contributes importantly to these debates by postulating on Plato’s behalf a kind of metaphysical monism. Namely, he contends that what Plato meant by ’matter’ is not just ’the great-and-small’ but something broader, i.e. the whole range of ’the unbounded and indefinite’ (202)--something strongly reminiscent of the unlimited in the Philebus. Moreover, he declares that matter thus conceived is not really a first principle (202).

As Dillon remarks, such differences point to elements of intra-Academic polemic (203). However, they never led to fractionism. The literary and poetical endeavours of Crantor of Soli, an Academic younger than Polemo (218-221), show the extent to which individual philosophers could deviate from Platonic orthodoxy. Undoubtedly, the fact that the school bore well the radical renewal of its tradition by Arcesilaus constitutes the strongest proof of both its flexibility and its self-assurance. In fact, Arcesilaus’ wholesale attack on dogmatic certainty and his reassertion of the Socratic aspects of Plato’s thought not only did not harm the unity of the Academy, but considerably increased its reputation with the result that the school continued to flourish, despite fierce competition from the Stoa (234-238).

I hope that I have given some idea of the contents of Dillon’s book and of its wealth of information and systematic analysis. Classicists and philosophers will learn a great deal from reading it. Also, they will probably enjoy Dillon’s clear and often witty prose, as I did.