The Hermeneutic Nature of Analytic Philosophy: A Study of Ernst Tugendhat

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Santiago Zabala, The Hermeneutic Nature of Analytic Philosophy: A Study of Ernst Tugendhat, Michael Haskell and Santiago Zabala (trs.) Columbia University Press, 2008, 199pp., $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231143882.

Reviewed by Robert Sokolowski, The Catholic University of America


This book is a translation of an Italian study that appeared in 2004. Its purpose is to introduce English readers to the work of Ernst Tugendhat, who has been an important figure in European philosophy for the past half-century. Tugendhat was born in 1930 in Brno, Czechoslovakia, into a Jewish family. His family moved to Switzerland in 1938 and then to Venezuela. He did his undergraduate studies in classics at Stanford. After the war, he returned to Germany and did doctoral work at Freiburg, where he was much influenced by Heidegger. His dissertation on Aristotle's theory of being and predication was published in 1958 under the title Ti kata tinos: Eine Untersuchung zu Struktur und Ursprung Aristotelischer Grundbegriffe. His Habilitationsschrift, also earned at Freiburg, was published in 1967 as Der Wahrheitsbegriff bei Husserl und Heidegger.

Tugendhat was invited for a semester in 1965 to the University of Michigan at Ann Arbor, where he came into contact with analytical philosophy. He found the approach congenial and his next major work was Traditional and Analytical Philosophy: Lectures on the Philosophy of Language. It appeared in German in 1976 and in English in 1982. The book was the outcome of a course given at Heidelberg in 1970. In it Tugendhat asserts the importance of focusing on actual speech and sentences and thus gives his reading of Heidegger and phenomenology something of a "linguistic turn," but he also tries to give a hermeneutic reading of linguistic analysis. Another major work, Self-Consciousness and Self-Determination, appeared in German in 1979 and in English in 1986. Since that time, Tugendhat has concentrated on issues concerning human rights, ethics, and mysticism. He taught at Heidelberg from the conclusion of his graduate studies until the mid 1970s, when he left Germany for Chile. He has since lived in both Germany and South America, has held research positions in Starnberg and Berlin, and has commented on current social, political, and international topics. Some observers have contrasted Tugendhat with Gadamer, both of whom were indebted to Heidegger at the beginning of their intellectual careers: Gadamer developed Heidegger's thought in a "hermeneutic" direction, and Tugendhat is said to have developed it along "linguistic" or "semantic" lines.

The book under review comprises 106 pages of text and 52 pages of endnotes. The introduction is followed by four chapters entitled "Overcoming Husserl," "Correcting Heidegger," "Semantizing Ontology," and "Philosophizing Analytically." There is a thirteen page epilogue with a conversation between Tugendhat and the author, in which Tugendhat looks back on his work and expresses his present understanding of philosophy and its role in our cultural and moral lives. The book contains a foreword by Gianni Vattimo and an eight-page bibliography of Tugendhat's writings.

Reviewing a book like this poses a special problem, because we are dealing with one author (Santiago Zabala) who writes about another author (Tugendhat) who in turn writes about still others. Should I comment on Husserl, Heidegger, and Gadamer, or on Tugendhat's interpretation of them and of analytic philosophy, or on Zabala's reading of Tugendhat and his interpretation of the others, or on Zabala's reading of the others? The review could become an occasion for postmodern revelry. Since the book under consideration is by Zabala, I ought to write primarily about what he says and how he says it. I should, however, mention my admiration for Tugendhat's work, which always exhibited the greatest precision and honesty. But there is a paradox in this book, because in the concluding interview Tugendhat expresses important reservations about the philosophical project described in the volume.

Husserl is criticized in Chapter 1 for being entrapped in "metaphysics" and its "remainders" (11) and for being "the slave of metaphysics" (13), for believing in "the mental eye" (a phrase used at least seven times in thirteen pages, as in "he remains attached to the metalanguage of the mental eye" [18] and "the mental eye of phenomenology" [16]), for having worked with a "pure and isolated subjectivity" (12, bis), for succumbing to representationalism (12, 20, 23, 31), for accepting a translinguistic subject-object dichotomy (21), and for thinking that we can intuit essences (12, 14). What Husserl needs, we are told, is a greater focus on actual linguistic practice and intersubjective conversation. As a devotee of Husserl may I say in his defense that he initiates his analysis of intentionality at the start of Logical Investigations not by staring at consciousness but by working out differences -- distinctions -- in the way we use words and by describing various formal dimensions of spoken and written words. What Husserl means by the noema ought not to be taken in a representationalist manner, and he does not think that we simply intuit essences but that we must ingeniously blend our intelligence and our imagination in order to get at the essentials of things. Also, Husserl has much to tell us about how we trope our ordinary language in order to adapt it for philosophical service. Phenomenology involves a modification of language. It is not a wordless objectification of consciousness.

In the 53 notes in this chapter, there are no citations from or references to Husserl's works. Only Tugendhat and several other interpreters are used. The prose is sometimes misleading. On p. 14, for example, Zabala writes, "According to Husserl, the 'a priori concepts, like all concepts, are understood as essences that must be inwardly perceived'." When we turn to the back of the book to find where this quotation comes from, we discover that it is from Tugendhat and not from Husserl. Nothing in the text warned us about this; the statement came across as Husserl's own. The author should have said "according to Tugendhat's interpretation of Husserl," particularly since the notes are not on the bottom of the page.

In Chapter 2, Zabala shows that Heidegger introduces a new dimension of truth, that of "the event of unconcealment" (27-28), and while this brings human temporality and finitude to the fore, it has the disadvantage, noted by Tugendhat, of undermining the standard sense of truth and falsity, which is attributed to statements or propositions, where it is known as the truth of correspondence or adequation, and it seems to occur independently of speech. Heidegger's elimination of standard truth and falsity can be linked to his inability to account for the difference between good and evil actions; indeed, Tugendhat's critique is said to have caused Heidegger to review his own thinking on the matter. The chapter also describes Tugendhat's criticism of Gadamer's hermeneutics. Hermeneutics sees thinking as taking place in locution with others, but Tugendhat observes that some elements of one's own naive and direct convictions need to be added to this conversational model. Here and later in the book Tugendhat is said to have criticized Gadamer's remarks about language for being too general and hence vague.

Chapter 3 works especially with the well-known article "Phenomenology and Linguistic Analysis." Tugendhat is shown to have claimed that linguistic analysis as a procedure in philosophy did not share the eliminative assumptions of logical positivism, and that ontological questions about being can be fruitfully treated by the analysis of predication and other verbal expressions related to being. Some interesting points are made in regard to negation; language has a word for negation ("not") but no word for affirmation, because an affirmation is inevitably included in every sentence (51), and such affirmation is "wordless." This would imply that our study of being can proceed by investigating it "only in the mirror image of negation." The examination of being should concentrate, therefore, on the spoken sentence, and it should explore the various senses of being in this connection. It should also avoid nominalizing things into "being" or "something" and thus falsely objectifying them, a distortion that is supposed to have occurred in traditional metaphysics. I find Tugendhat's and Zabala's remarks about affirmation appealing, and I would claim that Husserl's concept of categorial articulation can help amplify them. I think that any categorial articulation is by default an affirmation, and I would claim that this connection between articulation and affirmation holds also in depictions, where the arrangement of images is implicitly a claim about "how things are." Also, I would ask whether affirmation in speech is truly wordless; does it not find an expression in the "is" or in other corresponding grammatical particles and placements? In the case of pictures, however, it is true that there are no explicit images that express affirmation or negation. In fact, pictures have no "grammatical" or syntactic particles of any sort. In this regard, they are different from sentences.

In Chapter 4 Zabala develops further Tugendhat's attempt to focus philosophical analysis on sentences and his warnings that we must avoid substantializing what we think about. To determine what concepts are we should turn to the use of predicates in speech, and to determine what objects are we should turn to the use of singular terms. "Formal semantics" should replace ontology. He strongly criticizes representationalism (82), the "inner picture" (73, 87) and the appeal to intuition, whether of our consciousness or of essences (76). He also observes, with Tugendhat, that linguistic analysis needs a deeper examination of its own historical origins in order to clarify the sense of the problems it deals with. We are reminded again that the "metaphysical tradition" thinks we can access things without the mediation of signs and that it ignores the communicative nature of language (82), but we are also informed that, alas, such perceptive thinkers as Strawson, Russell, Kripke, and Donnellan have "fallen back into metaphysics" (83). The final section of the chapter deals with self-consciousness, with mention of the distinctive treatment of this topic developed by the Heidelberg School (Dieter Henrich et al.). Zabala and Tugendhat claim that even self-consciousness is propositional and linguistic, and that the personal pronoun "I" needs to be examined in relation to its use by a definite person endowed with self-consciousness (91). The chapter ends with the claim that Tugendhat's semantization of Heidegger's ontology shows how the turn to language is the best instrument for the "emancipation from metaphysics."

The main part of the book deals with Tugendhat's linguistic approach to ontology, but as I mentioned previously Tugendhat has turned his attention to other issues since the early 1980s, so the epilogue, "The Linguistic Turn as the End of Metaphysics," looks at the material in the book from a great distance. Tugendhat's remarks in the interview express much wisdom. He has taken a Socratic turn: "I'm now concerned with human problems and how one should understand them" (99), but he does not think that philosophy gets reduced to action, or the theoretic life to the practical: "Philosophy cannot be replaced with a political order. Philosophers must continue to think on fundamental concepts of our thought and life" (102). He says that "all human understanding is grounded on an understanding of Being" (103), but the issue of being ought to be more simply and directly stated, and not explored just by commentary on other authors; the history of philosophy is not the prime target of philosophical thinking, but it can serve as a "quarry" from which one might take valuable thoughts and problems (100). One feature of such ontological exploration is that "the word 'Being' dos not have one single meaning" (104). He is concerned with mysticism, and thinks that what he is interested in "can be found in a more simple, pure state in other cultures" (100). He relates this issue to Wittgenstein's remark, "I wonder that anything exists" (104). Heidegger proved to be more and more disappointing: "I believe that there is very little left of Heidegger's philosophy" (99). A major reason for this outcome is: "I think there is an important distinction that we cannot leave hanging: the difference between appearance and truth. This is something that dissolves in Heidegger" (105; also 103). He dismisses Heidegger's idea of overcoming metaphysics "because I do not see this entity" (99). Tugendhat observes that we as human beings enjoy "propositional language," which is different "from other animals' languages," and he exhorts us to explore "what is structurally characteristic of it" (105). He describes his own work: "I've only tried to rescue traditional problems and this, in a certain way, I keep on doing" (99).

Tugendhat's remarks in the interview are direct and clear, but I found Zabala's exposition of his thought in the rest of the book hard to follow. I found it difficult to understand many of the sentences in this book. For example, on p. 8 the author says, "Tugendhat's analytical philosophy became possible thanks to phenomenology, a system of thought characterized by both positions." I cannot figure out what these two positions are. The author had just spoken about two stages in Heidegger's thought; could the two positions be these two stages? But how could phenomenology be characterized by the two stages of Heidegger's thought, since it is not identifiable with him? Are the two positions analytical philosophy and phenomenology? This seems unlikely; it would imply that phenomenology is a feature of itself. Perhaps they are the earlier and later stages in the thought of any philosopher who changes his mind (sixteen lines earlier the author had discussed such changes in "position" and he referred to Wittgenstein as well as Heidegger). I have looked at this sentence a long time and I still cannot understand it. The book contains many such unclear sentences -- they suffer from what Husserl in Formal and Transcendental Logic §16 calls Verworrenheit -- and they make the book hard to read. I constantly needed to interrupt my reading to try to decipher what is being said, and I often was unsuccessful. The book does not move smoothly forward. Here is another example: "Human understanding is neither a transcendental consciousness nor an overworldly consciousness but a linguistic, empirical, existential community" (7-8). Human understanding might be found within a community or it can be considered intersubjective, but it is not a community. Also, as a reader, I found myself desperately wishing for concrete examples that would illustrate the points being made, just to be reassured that we were not getting lost in abstract verbiage.

Some problems may have arisen in translation, such as the use of "surround" in the phrase "There is no way to surround language to reach the object in itself" (94). Should the word be "circumvent"? Another example: "The Husserlian theory of categorical (sic) acts was tentative to comprehend … the meaning of composed expressions" (21). There are typographical and stylistic infelicities. On p. xvii we are referred to p. 000. "Ricoeur" is misspelled on pp. xvi, xvii, 114 (twice) and 117, but is correct elsewhere. Some transliterations of Greek terms are incorrect (chategorein, twice on p. 26; apophainesdai, twice on p. 35; and long vowels are not marked). Witherspoon is referenced in a note on p. 137 but the full entry is not given in the bibliography. These problems of style and exposition are regrettable, because Tugendhat is a formidable philosopher whose work deserves close study. On the positive side, the book is an informative guide to his writings and it effectively situates him within 20th century thought. It contains an abundance of secondary sources. There is valuable material in the book, but it needs to be made more exact.