The Hermetic Deleuze: Philosophy and Spiritual Ordeal

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Joshua Ramey, The Hermetic Deleuze: Philosophy and Spiritual Ordeal, Duke University Press, 2012, 304pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822352297.

Reviewed by Dorothea Olkowski, University of Colorado


Current research and scholarship on the philosopher, Gilles Deleuze, is wide-ranging and vast. A recent Google search generated over two million results. Each new interpretation of Deleuze's work seems to generate a response in the form of a counter position. One seemingly major new trend, especially among scholars with political interests, is to associate Deleuze with physicalism or materialism, the ontological or metaphysical view that everything that actually exists is physical or material. The counter to this must certainly be that coming from those who see in Deleuze a sort of theophanic vision of reality, a unique transcendence specific to immanence achieved through intensified relations with the world, mediated by ritual, meditation or magical practice. This is the view of Deleuze that Joshua Ramey has set forth,in this book. Ramey's fundamental argument is that, for Deleuze, the power of thought is an initiatory ordeal that takes place by means of an immersion of the "self" in the uncanny so as to reveal a complicity of nature and psyche (2). Thus, the claim is that Deleuze stands as a contemporary avatar of "hermetic" thought, which can be traced back to the third-century, and for which knowledge requires a profound transformation of the self and a resulting unification of materiality and spirituality, evoked by the mantra "as above, so below" (2-3). Ramey argues that Deleuze's project of overturning Platonism should be read as a contemporary hermetic resituating of philosophy as an experimental exploration of nature, the clearest model of which is the work of art and artistic procedures (6-7). Indeed some of Ramey's most effective arguments arise in the context of works of art and aesthetic thinking in general.

Ramey begins his exposition with an account of early modern philosophy, which, he argues, opposes rationality to affective, imaginative, and spiritual modalities of mind. He points to the early Baroque period's exaggerations, elongations, and distortions, the conception of God as nature in Spinoza, or as illusion in Hume, and limit-idea in Kant, the inability of the human mind to think the infinite, and he connects these notions to the Deleuzian plane of immanence with its infinity of vectors, of which "belief" is only one trajectory (12-13). The question this raises is, what is the grounding of modern philosophy? For Deleuze, the idea is no longer a representation of reality, but an opening onto a range of experimental possibilities, which, as Deleuze states, "belong to the order of dreams, of pathological processes, esoteric experiences, drunkenness, and excess" (17).

This is indeed, a new image of thought, and it is also, in many respects early modern. For example, in Deleuze's realm of immanent thought "chaos does not exist" because nature is always oriented by singularities (21). Perhaps this could be situated along with the realization that Newton, widely known to have practiced alchemy, also worked on developing successively more and more accurate mathematical approximations so that a deterministic model of the universe, which served as an ideal limit, a singularity, could be created. This would be a model without the contemporary idea of chaos, where chaos describes systems governed by mathematically simple equations that can and do result in unpredictable behavior. From this point of view, Deleuze's embrace of hermetic concepts is as much a function of his grounding in classical science as in the darker aspects of Artaud's theater of cruelty, that is, the exploration of artists who undergo intense ordeals (23).

In Difference and Repetition, Deleuze introduces the notion of the dark precursor as the power to dissolve the harmony of the Kantian faculties of intuition, understanding, and reason. Under the rule of the dark precursor, each communicates to the other only difference and discord, on the order of the catastrophic discord between imagination and thought in Kant's conception of the sublime. Ramey reads this notion as the very core of the hermetic tradition as found in Spinoza's undoing of hierarchies, his shift from a model of internal relations of parts to one of purely external relations, and the conception of the univocity of being as an expression of one, infinite substance (35-36). These concepts are said to belong to the experimental affirmation of the world beyond what is sensibly observable or divinely revealed, leading to a more comprehensive and intense level of thought and being (36). These concepts are also, let us note, central to the Newtonian scientific world view which arose especially after the invention of the telescope proved once and for all that the senses cannot be trusted, and which eliminated transcendence and hierarchy through the introduction of calculus and absolute as well as homogeneous space and time.

It is probably also relevant that the Renaissance theologian, mathematician and philosopher, and mystic, Cardinal Nicholas of Cusa (1401-1464) made use of mathematical ideas to explain his notion of God and infinity as, "an identity that can be thought but not understood" (44). Just as for the classical universe, Cusa anticipated that the motions of the planets and stars are neither circular nor uniform, but Cusa's mathematical speculations also led him to posit an infinite cosmos with no distinct center, and to the realization that on a large enough scale, what appears to the senses as a circle, becomes a straight line. Thus, as Ramey points out, Deleuze's invocation of Cusa's insights, especially the ideas of inherence and implication and of the equality of being, provides him with a set of terms that are translated into a naturalized version of Cusa's theology (46). Ramey goes on to show that Giordano Bruno (1548-1600) breaks with Cusa's theology by conceiving of the infinite universe and proposing a "more difficult theology," a "kind of hermetic naturalism in which nature itself is conceived as a fully immanent deity" (63). This "animist" reconciliation of beast and human essence is correlated with Deleuze and Félix Guattari's notion of sorcery defined as psychic mutation and physical rarefaction (64).

However, according to Ramey, Bruno privileges the fecundity of matter over form, leading to the question, is this what Deleuze is doing when he writes that "the entire world may be read, as through a crystal ball, in the moving depths of individuating differences or differences in intensity" (241). Deleuze's stated mechanism for modeling difference is the differential equation. Differential equations describe growth, development, and decay mathematically. The basic operation of differential calculus is differentiation, the method of obtaining the rate of change of some changing quantity; thus a differential equation allows us to measure quantities subject to change. In order to be intelligible, matter must be able to be quantified, implying that it must be structured mathematically from the start. It is this idea that could be the real overturning of Platonism, an idea that does not begin in the sensory realm but is pure idea. Thus, the life of God, defined by Deleuze and Guattari as an organic life, is possibly much less a reference to inert matter than a reference to "resonant disjunctive syntheses," logical processes which Immanuel Kant identifies with the Idea of God (80).

Deleuze's commitment to the ideal is again apparent in Ramey's fascinating chapter on an early publication, the preface to a French translation of a work on mathesis by a 19th century doctor, Johann Malfatti de Montereggio. Deleuze asked to have this preface purged from his official bibliography, but does, as Ramey points out, refer to the concept of mathesis in his later work (89). The mathesis universalis is mostly associated with Gottfried Leibniz, who formulated it as the idea of a universal formal grammar enabling exhaustive knowledge (91). Ramey points out that when Deleuze refers to the mathesis universalis in Difference and Repetition, he says that it corresponds to his own theory of ideas, which has strong ties to the calculus of ideal events that occasionally explode into the real (92). Thus it seems that the symbolism here is once again mathematical, a manner of formulating ideas whose virtual reality sometimes is actualized. Although there is much in this chapter that bears consideration, the key point may be that the concept of a symbolic network is carried, by Deleuze, into the realm of immanence "common to art, science and philosophy" (103).

It should be clear by now that this book is comprehensive and detailed. The remaining chapters focus more directly on Deleuze's own work, and the manner in which Ramey believes it to be embedded in hermetic concepts. Ramey is an astute reader of Deleuze who is able to connect and explain numerous otherwise ambiguous concepts in his thinking. Notable, in these chapters, is Deleuze's overturning, not only of Platonism, but more significantly, of representation. What Deleuze does take away from Plato, for Ramey, is that ideas change and transform the thinker and that philosophical questions, posed as problems with a problematic structure, remove the thinker to the transcendental dimension, especially since the sensible world produces only "incoherent 'qualitative contrariety" (120-123). Certainly affective intensity and differential repetition play a key role in this process, and for Deleuze, it is the artist who most singularly brings this to the fore in his or her work.

This resistance to habit and representation appears most powerfully in Proust and the painter Francis Bacon, but also in the philosophical conceptual personae, which are not so much persons as receptacles and transmitters of forces whose power they emit as signs, as abstract blocs of affects and percepts, blocs of becoming that are works of literature, art, and philosophy (139-170). If this is the meaning of sorcery, then possibly Deleuze's philosophy is a product of the hermetic doctrines as Ramey seems to want to claim. But although it seems clear from this beautifully written and well-researched book that Deleuze was familiar with hermetic doctrines and made used of hermetic concepts throughout his work, it may be for a slightly different reason than the one Ramey seems to give. That is, the hermeticists were truly looking for ways of thinking and working outside of the prevailing dogmas of their eras. They hid much of their work or they were punished for their views, which contemporary readers of Deleuze might be tempted to call "minor." Yet it also seems possible that Deleuze's "spiritual automaton" who "transmit[s] the spiritual sense of the world directly to the brain," bypassing the organized perceptual apparatus of subjectivity, is less a hermetic than a modernist like Francis Bacon. In his book on Bacon, Deleuze says that nature's physical forces follow the laws of supersensible Reason to produce the Event. The Event consists of real, physical, and effective sensations that bypass Imagination and Understanding, and directly affect the nervous system, no intuitions or perceptions needed. Given that Bacon began with photographic representations, it was his task to wipe away all traces of organicism and return to the Idea, the sign, the thought of affects and percepts, which, insofar as this appears as an act of sorcery, should certainly provoke us to consider what Ramey offers us for contemplation.