The Hiddenness Argument: Philosophy's New Challenge to Belief in God

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 J. L. Schellenberg, The Hiddenness Argument: Philosophy's New Challenge to Belief in God, Oxford University Press, 2015, 142pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198733089.

Reviewed by Adam Green, Azusa Pacific University


J.L. Schellenberg's book is an attempt to spell out his well-known argument from divine hiddenness against theism patiently and systematically so that anyone can understand it. One can see it as an atheistic mirror to the kind of book one sometimes sees theistic philosophers write where the author takes the fine-tuning argument or kalaam cosmological argument and tries to find a way to equip the average church goer to understand and profit from it. If one is familiar with the theistic equivalent, then one should realize that it can be hard to balance technical due diligence and the demands of addressing such a broad audience. If that's the right way to think about the kind of book Schellenberg has written, however, I think it is largely successful. The average person on the street can pick up this book, and a trim 142 pages later, they'll understand what the hiddenness argument is and why it is for many an important piece of evidence against theism.

Since the exact terms of Schellenberg's argument (though not the spirit) have changed a bit over the years, let's begin by quoting the version given in the book.

  1. If a perfectly loving God exists, then there exists a God who is always open to a personal relationship with any finite person.
  2. If there exists a God who is always open to a personal relationship with any finite person, then no finite person is ever nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists.
  3. If a perfectly loving God exists, then no finite person is ever nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists (from 1 and 2).
  4. Some finite persons are or have been nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists.
  5. No perfectly loving God exists (from 3 and 4).
  6. If no perfectly loving God exists, then God does not exist.
  7. God does not exist (from 5 and 6) (Schellenberg 103)

After a first chapter explaining some of the basics of what an argument is and what logic does, Schellenberg introduces the terms "hiddenness" and "ultimism". He tries to ensure that the uninitiated reader won't read too much into the colorful image of a God who hides and instead focuses the reader's attention on the question of whether this is a world in which at least some people do not believe in God's existence and not because they are resistant to so believing. Likewise, in his discussion of "ultimism", Schellenberg is at pains to point out to the uninitiated reader that he is not arguing against there being any ultimate or religious dimension to reality but rather against a vision of ultimate reality that sees ultimate reality as personal. Whatever is supposed to be unfathomable about God, God's being personal needs to be something we can get our teeth into lest theism collapse into ultimism, but for Schellenberg, that's all the grip we need on the concept of God for the hiddenness argument to have bite.

Schellenberg stresses the way in which his argument is "from above". The argument is not one that begins with the experience of anguish that some feel when in the throes of doubt as to God's existence, for example. (That experience has a role to play downstream in the argument as evidence of nonresistance, but it's not at the heart of the argument). Rather, one might think of the argument as a kind of regimented meditation on the demands of perfect love. If one could free one's mind from how the world actually is and instead think about what a perfectly loving being would be like, then one has the starting point for Schellenberg's argument. Schellenberg is, in a way, turning perfect being theology back on itself. Schellenberg demands that those who believe in a perfect God of love not lower their standards in reaction to problematic features of the world we actually live in. Better to be intellectually honest and admit that there is no such God.

Specifically, if we ask whether an infinitely resourceful being who loves us perfectly would allow people to fail to believe in that being's existence, Schellenberg thinks that we should all say that is not, in fact, how perfect love would manifest itself. Belief in the existence of another person is so obviously important to relationship that one can only assume that it would be important to a God of love as well. Moreover, it is a rather minimal demand to make of a being who is supposed to be perfectly loving. One could argue, for instance, that an infinitely loving God would make the beloved always aware that they are attended to and cared for, but Schellenberg fixes on something that should strike us as a little thing to ask of the greatest possible lover. If, however, God does not set up and rule the world so as to even guarantee something so minimal and foundational to relationship as belief that the lover exists, then how, one might ask, can one believe that God exists? Whatever allure the idea holds for us, Schellenberg thinks we must conclude that no such perfect lover exists.

Given the nature of the project, the book will cover familiar territory for those who have been following the literature. There is, however, at least one respect in which I think even those familiar with the hiddenness literature can benefit from the book. In his books, articles, and talks, Schellenberg has commented on how interlocutors have distorted or misappropriated his argument. Moreover, defending and elaborating an argument for 25 years or so is bound to bring with it clarity on what is and is not essential to the argument. Throughout the book but especially in chapter eight, Schellenberg very nicely sums up the various misrepresentations of and objections to his argument that he's seen over the years, and he gives crystal clear expressions of exactly what he's committed to or where he thinks objections go wrong. Collecting these threads in one place with the benefit of extensive hindsight and in a context where communicating to an audience of minimal background is a priority makes for a very handy field guide to how Schellenberg sees the literature for those seeking to wrestle with or appropriate his argument. It is not, once again, that the material can't be found elsewhere in Schellenberg's corpus. Most if not all of it can, but I'm not aware of another place where it is collected in a way that is quite as useful as it is here.

Here are just a few of the comments and clarifications that stood out to this reviewer.

Readers of Schellenberg might notice that over time he switches from talking centrally about culpable nonbelief to talking about nonresistant nonbelief. On pages 54-55, he clarifies that focusing on culpability was a mistake. I find this a move worth paying attention to for two reasons. On the one hand, it seems like we are very familiar with cases of inculpable resistance, that is, where we find ourselves resisting an idea in a way that is not blameworthy. Thus, a move to language of resistance to characterize the cases in which a perfectly loving God might allow non-belief might unintentionally broaden the scope of cases in which the argument allows a perfectly loving being and nonbelief to coexist. On the other hand, if we interpret the language of resistance as a narrowing of the kind of culpability that is required to get in the way of perfect love, that is "self-deceptive resistance" that includes "a desire not to be in a relationship with God, or else to be in a condition incompatible with relationship with God" (55), then the argument again evolves in an interesting way. One might at least wonder whether it is as clear as one might have initially thought that only resistance would be allowed to get in the way of belief in God if the resistance in question ends up being construed in a really demanding way.

Throughout the book but particularly on page 106, Schellenberg doubles down on (i) its being belief in God that is important to his argument and (ii) that only a particular way of being related is meant by "relationship", namely, "conscious, reciprocal relationship." Religious experience is neither necessary nor sufficient to alleviate divine hiddenness. God is hidden when nonresistant nonbelief is present, otherwise not. God does not have to intervene in the world or one's life in any interesting way. Coming to belief in God is allowed to be difficult and even unpleasant. There can be "innumerable styles of personal relationship with God". What is non-negotiable is that God, because perfectly loving, would make sure that everyone believed that this perfect lover existed.

Likewise, Schellenberg thinks that a perfectly loving being would aim at and, if as resourceful as God, would make possible a conscious, reciprocal relationship with all of us. In fact, "unsurpassable benevolence" towards us does not count as sufficiently loving to claim of God that God is unsurpassably loving (105). We get a window into how Schellenberg is thinking about what does and does not count as being related to God when he argues that early humans and indeed any human existing prior to the rise of monotheism can be easily and automatically assigned to the class of persons who are nonresistant nonbelievers (76-79). In fact, he calls this "the easy case" and discusses these cases before moving to the case of principled atheism or agnosticism. The reason Schellenberg supposes that these are easy cases is that he thinks these people "never have had a real chance to think about God" (106; emphasis in the original).

I think these two stances interact in interesting ways. On the one hand, there are all kinds of relational goods that Schellenberg sets aside because he thinks that a laser focus on belief will provide the strongest possible argument. God could be absent from the created order in any way you like. If God had only put a sensus divinitatis in each of our heads that produced an explicit belief in personal ultimism, the argument would be answered. On the other hand, the kind of relationship that Schellenberg insists a perfectly loving God would be after is something that clearly goes well beyond anything that such a mere belief could ever ensure. Juxtaposing these two stances in Schellenberg makes one wonder anew whether the logical space between mere belief and the greatest goods of relationship can't be exploited in some way. Schellenberg argues against holding out hope that a non-relational good will trump the end of love for a God of perfect love, but I wonder whether there might be room for a greater relational good to trump a lesser one given the minimalness of Schellenberg's belief condition and the demandingness of the kind of relationship he thinks God would want. To counter certain objections to his views, Schellenberg stresses that a relationship with God would grow and develop over time and that experiencing God as absent could, for those who believe, produce greater relational goods downstream of a trying dark night of the soul, at least in principle (109-110). Interestingly though, he is steadfast in the conviction that a loving God would not allow a portion of this development to occur before one had an explicit belief in a personal God.

I note in passing several claims that come at the very end of the book that stand out as quite bold. On page 111, Schellenberg describes an objection to his view from unknown goods. Although it is not named as such, this is the skeptical theism position as deployed against the hiddenness argument. He says of this response that it is a "logical foul". The reason he gives is that the objector is not honoring the deductive format of the argument. It, in effect, doesn't matter whether one is ignorant of much of a domain if one can clearly see that the premises of one's deductive argument are true. I think skeptical theists will find this remark a head-scratcher. I wonder, though, whether what lies in the background of Schellenberg's critique here is his analysis of theism as personal ultimism. One might think that, from this perspective, appeals to mystery might be appropriate as applied to the ultimism portion of theism. But since Schellenberg thinks that "personal" needs to be a descriptor that we can get our minds around for theism to have distinctive content as an alternative to pure ultimism, I wonder if his conviction that the skeptical response is committing some kind of logical foul is rooted "ultimately" in this conceptual background at the foundation of his position. I think the thought is that you can't assert theism over alternatives while denying apparently true premises that apply to that portion of the position that must be within our ken for theism to be tenable. Whether my reconstruction is right or not, Schellenberg's claim is notable.

A similarly striking set of assertions at the end of the book has to do with Schellenberg's claim that the hiddenness argument trumps for structural reasons arguments for God's existence and at worst fights to a standoff any religious experiences one can have (113-116). Schellenberg says that the hiddenness argument trumps arguments for God existence because such arguments these days are inductive. Since deductive arguments are logically stronger than inductive arguments, hiddenness wins. Likewise, since the conclusion of a good deductive argument must follow, it cannot be trumped by a contrary experience. Now, what may be true of deductive arguments need not be true of deductive reasoners and their reasoning. I find the confidence that Schellenberg displays in the latter really fascinating. Consider, for instance, external world skepticism or logical paradoxes. You don't have to have been doing philosophy very long to discover deductive arguments that seem to have plausible premises and no apparent flaw in their form but which hold our collective attention because we collectively tend to think they've got to have something wrong with them even if we can't see it. I wonder what the implications would be if we took Schellenberg's optimism about human reasoning and applied it more broadly.

In closing, perhaps one of the things that has struck me the most about the development of Schellenberg's thought is precisely his optimism about human reason and its prospects. The spirit of Schellenberg's work is never one of pessimistic judgment about the errors and superstitions of religious folk. He is not a mocker. Rather, his writing seems to flow from a conviction that there's so much out there to explore. I found no more telling quote in his book to the spirit of Schellenberg's work than this one:

People like to say there are no original ideas. I dislike this idea because it's so unoriginal . . . I think a great many more original ideas may be found far down the road in science and philosophy, because intelligence on our planet might have miles to go before it sleeps (23).