The Hiddenness of God

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Michael C. Rea, The Hiddenness of God, Oxford University Press, 2018, 198pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198826019.

Reviewed by Charity Anderson, Baylor University


Some people seek God, but seem not to find him. To others, God seems distant or absent. In one way or another, God seems hidden to many people. This is unexpected if there is a God who wants us to know that he exists, and even more puzzling if there is a God that loves us. Not only is the situation puzzling, but it causes some people significant pain. In various ways, divine hiddenness has been thought to pose a challenge to traditional Christian theism. Michael C. Rea's book offers a multifaceted response to phenomena related to God's apparent hiddenness and the family of philosophical problems it raises.

The version of the hiddenness problem most discussed in current literature Rea calls 'the Schellenberg problem.' The Schellenberg problem suffers from an important drawback: it does not target the God of Christian theism, according to Rea. But the Schellenberg problem is just one among many problems of divine hiddenness. Rea prefers to think of the problem as a family of problems and advances his own characterization of what unites them: in general, the problem of divine hiddenness is "fundamentally a problem of violated expectations." People have various expectations of what a loving God would be like -- they might expect him to have provided more religious experience than they have, or stronger evidence, or expect that theistic belief would be more widespread than it is. Hiddenness arguments take the violation of these expectations as reasons to conclude that God does not exist. Rather than respond to just one particular hiddenness argument, Rea addresses hiddenness arguments that take this general form.

Rea's solution to the problem is two-tiered. The first step is to argue that the hiddenness problem rests on unwarranted assumptions and expectations about God's love. He offers two different arguments to this end (the first in Ch. 3-4 and the second in Ch. 5).

Chapters 3 and 4 work in tandem to bring the attribute of God's transcendence to bear on the problem. Rea argues that God's transcendence is relevant to our expectations of what divine behavior towards us would look like. Finding a middle ground on the spectrum of lightweight and heavyweight interpretations of transcendence, Rea understands God's transcendence to (minimally) imply that "intrinsic substantive predications of God or of the divine nature that express non-revealed concepts are, at best, analogical" (51). Divine love is one such concept. One result of God's transcendence is that we cannot understand divine love by merely analyzing the concept of love or by extrapolating from paradigmatic examples of human love. Transcendence implies that all of God's intrinsic attributes -- including love -- elude our grasp. We just can't be very confident in what divine love would look like.

Rea's preliminary conclusion is thus that violated expectations do not entitle us to conclude that God is unloving. Our grasp of divine love is too limited. Instead, he suggests that we adopt a stance of humility about our expectations of God. Humility about expectations undermines the problem of hiddenness because it prevents an inference from 'I expected divine love to look like X,' to the conclusion that God isn't loving. Since we cannot be confident that perfect love precludes divine hiddenness, key premises of many versions of the hiddenness problem are unmotivated.

What Rea says here strikes me as compelling, but I wonder whether we need to rely on divine transcendence to motivate this kind of response. Rea anticipates that not everyone will want to take transcendence on board, and offers a different route to the same conclusion.

In Chapter 5, Rea sets aside divine transcendence and offers an independent argument for why we should not expect divine love to look like ideal human love. Divine love is often characterized as analogous to the love of a parent or spouse. Rea thinks it is misguided to rely exclusively on this type of analogy, and challenges the assumption that God's love is an idealized version of human love. There is reason for thinking that, in general, to have an attribute in an 'ideal' way involves having the attribute without limitation. Combined with the conception of love Rea accepts, ideal love would involve unlimited desire for union with and unlimited desire for the good of the beloved. Drawing on Susan Wolf's argument against aspiring to become a moral saint, [1] Rea suggests that just as it strikes us as unfitting for a person to give up all of her own interests and pursuits in order to serve others, it would be bad for God to orient his pursuits around human beings. It is good that God has his own interests. In fact, it is an important part of what it is for God to be a person. God's love is perfect love, according to Rea, but not ideal love. Chapter 5 concludes the first step of Rea's response to the hiddenness problem.

But even if these first arguments are successful, a problem lingers. That is, even if divine hiddenness doesn't entitle us to infer that a loving God does not exist, hiddenness seems to support negatively valanced analogies of God as distant or absent. How can God be aptly described as perfectly loving, as the Christian tradition maintains, in light of divine hiddenness? Rea turns to address this difficulty for the remainder of the book. He identifies three sources of negatively valanced analogies of divine love: restricted access to divine presence, severely conflicted relationship with God, and religious trauma. Without attempting to provide a comprehensive treatment of the topic, Rea seeks to reduce the force of these analogies by offering a narrative according to which God is widely available for positive meaningful relationship with all people -- even if that relationship consists in mere seeking.

Chapters 6-7 argue that experiential access to God's presence is more widely available than is typically thought. Rea holds that access to presence is a basic component of personal relationship and offers a metaphysics of divine presence that explains how God is experientially available to us.

After introducing the familiar idea that experience of God is akin to a habit, ability, or learnable skill that can be developed through religious practices, Rea notes that this way of thinking about divine presence may reinforce the negative analogies he seeks to oppose. While affirming the importance of a learnable skill in experience of God, Rea distances his position from what might be considered a more standard position. A common picture is one whereby the skill involved in divine encounters facilitates one's coming into special causal contact with God -- contact which involves God responding to the person's efforts. On Rea's picture, however, there is no special causal contact with God. Experience of God consists in cognitively impacted experiences (similar to cognitive penetration) caused by purely natural stimuli. Though such experiences do not involve direct causal contact with God, God must be intentionally causally involved for the encounters to be veridical. Many divine encounters are ordinary -- for example, a thought or memory coming to mind at just the right moment or a sense of awe of God while watching the sunset -- as opposed to ecstatic mystical visions. Although God is not the immediate stimulus of these experiences, according to Rea the experiences are still of God.

Here's an example: on Rea's picture, when Moses received the 10 Commandments, he did not hear an audible voice -- that is, he did not hear a voice that anyone who was standing near him would've heard. Instead, Moses heard the thunder, and as a result heard God. Rea maintains that although on his account Moses heard God as a result of cognitively impacted experience that was directly caused by the thunder, Moses genuinely heard God.

There is much that will be of interest in these chapters to those who wish to understand religious experience. Rea offers an account well-worth engaging. I expect some may hesitate to jump on board and accept Rea's broader picture here. He offers several motivations for the view, among which is the uniformity assumption, which states that God operated in biblical times in roughly the same way he operates now. It's not clear exactly how much rests on this assumption for Rea, but it's also not clear that one must agree with this assumption or with the details of his theory of religious experience in order to accept his thesis as it relates to divine hiddenness. For the purposes of the hiddenness dialectic, the main contribution of these chapters is to argue that God communicates readily and widely via divine encounters. The wide availability of his presence counters the picture of God as a distant lover.

Chapters 8-9 contribute to Rea's aim to undercut two further sources of negatively valanced analogies about divine love. Some people have intensely conflicted relationships with God. Past abusive religious experience leaves some people angry at God. Some view God as neglectful, others cannot even think about God. It seems, from the outside, that God fails to love these individuals. To counter this picture, Rea draws on biblical narrative to make three points (Ch. 8): first, that God takes Job's (and also our) grievances seriously; second, that there is evidence of a broad and general pattern of God's concern for our grievances; and third, that the same means of responding to our grievances are available to us as were available to Job and to Israel. These means include protest and lament. God not only welcomes lament and protest, he authorizes and "validates" it (though without endorsing the content of the protest). The idea is that bringing grievances to God counts as a way of participating in relationship. This chapter will be especially valuable and useful for those personally affected by divine hiddenness.

Finally, in Chapter 9, Rea addresses those that have suffered from religious trauma or who lack the concept of God and argues that almost anyone can participate in relationship with God 'just by trying.' Rea points to various ways that God provides a path forward for people in this last group.

The book has many virtues, among which are its incorporation of theological reflection and Rea's sensitivity to the existential importance of the argument to many people. Rea does not treat hiddenness merely as an argument for or against God's existence. He engages with the problem authentically from within the religious framework to which he is committed. The result is a book that bears the mark of much personal reflection on the topic.

Rea's book is a rich and rewarding read. It will be of interest to anyone who grapples with divine hiddenness, and is essential reading for those who work on the philosophical problem.

[1] Wolf, (1982) “Moral Saints”. Journal of Philosophy 79:419-39.