The Highest Good in Aristotle and Kant

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Joachim Aufderheide and Ralf M. Bader (eds.), The Highest Good in Aristotle and Kant, Oxford University Press, 2015, 245pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714019.

Reviewed by Mavis Biss, Loyola University Maryland


This engaging collection brings together essays delivered at a conference on the highest good in Aristotle and Kant held at the University of St. Andrews in 2010. It builds upon the influential reevaluation of the relationship between these two thinkers presented in Aristotle, Kant and the Stoics (1996),[1] but unlike its predecessor, this volume focuses on a specific concept and most of the essays are not primarily comparative. In their introduction the editors contrast the "structureless" version of the highest good at play in consequentialist theories with the more complex Aristotelian and Kantian conceptions of the highest good as "the source or condition of the goodness of other goods" (1). Aristotle's highest good is not something that can be maximized; rather, it is the end for the sake of which all other goods are chosen -- eudaimonia. Kant understands the highest good, most basically, as happiness proportionate to virtue, where virtue is the unconditioned good and happiness is the conditioned good. The main goal of the collection is to reestablish the centrality of these complex conceptions to their respective ethical frameworks and thereby refocus scholarship in the Aristotelian and Kantian traditions on value-theoretic questions. The editors wish to recover something that has been lost for the sake of enriching contemporary moral theory. After a brief overview of the contents I will focus my comments on the essays most relevant to this goal.

Two comparative essays separate the four essays focused on Aristotle from the four essays focused on Kant. Dorothea Frede addresses the question of how, according to Aristotle, the good intended by action is fixed, while Joachim Aufderheide argues for an intellectualist interpretation of Aristotelian eudaimonia. David Charles develops an alternative to inclusivist and dominant end interpretations of the human good, while Christopher Shields explains how Aristotle's anti-Platonism is in tension with his claims regarding the highest good for human beings. Robert B. Louden and Stephen Engstrom contribute comparative essays that emphasize similarities between Aristotle's and Kant's approaches to the highest good, though Engstrom focuses specifically on their agreement concerning the object of practical knowledge. Rachel Barney illuminates how, taken as a whole, Kant's account of the highest good answers to reason's demand for justice, while David Sussman proposes that our need for the highest good is analogous to our need for beauty in the natural world. Ralf M. Bader interprets the account of the highest good presented in the Critique of Practical Reason, and Jens Timmermann reconstructs Kant's argument for one specific claim made in this text, namely, that knowledge of the existence of God would render the realization of the highest good impossible.

Of the essays focused on Aristotle, Aufderheide's is the only one that interprets eudaimonia as consisting in a single good. Aufderheide seeks to show that the argument in EN 1.12 supports the claim that Aristotle identifies happiness with the activity of reflection (theoria) and not with virtuous activity. Here Aristotle makes a distinction between praiseworthy and honorable things, explaining that virtue is praiseworthy and happiness is honorable. According to Aufderheide's reading, "to praise something is to relate it to some other and better good," and so the basis of praise is "usefulness in relation to this other good" (41). Compared to praiseworthy things, honorable things are better, more divine and perfect. Consistent with Aristotle's treatment of the praiseworthy and the honorable as mutually exclusive categories in EN 1.12, Aufderheide rejects the commonly held view that Aristotle considers virtuous activity to be desirable for its own sake and for the sake of something else. Aufderheide presents a remedial view of ethical virtue, claiming that virtuous action "is chosen to set things right" (48). He writes, "Instead of bringing about the fine through his virtuous action, it would be better to live in an environment that does not make such actions necessary" (48). This remark seems to suggest that the exercise of ethical virtue is analogous to a reluctant homeowner's plumbing skills -- instead of fixing the sink through his own efforts, it would be better to live in a building with a handyman.

Many readers will doubt that Aristotelian ethical action fits this model, as it is inconsistent with central aspects of Aristotle's ethics, including the nameless virtues, such as wit and friendliness, and Aristotle's theory of friendship. (Much of Paula Gottlieb's recent critique of Christine Korsgaard's remedial view of Aristotelian ethical virtue applies to Aufderheide's account.)[2] Aufderheide's "strict intellectualist" position, according to which virtuous action is "simply a precondition for proper contemplation," construes human sociality as a necessary obstacle in the pursuit of happiness (56). Other people are the "environment" that places demands on the agent, who must perform required actions and hope to have some time left over for contemplation, the activity that makes a life happy. It is hard to accept the notion that the virtuous human being cultivates wit so that she may deliver morally required jokes in the discrete situations that "demand" them. Although I do not find the case that Aufderheide makes for happiness as contemplation convincing as a general interpretation of Aristotle or as a conception of the highest good that might enrich contemporary ethical theories, his essay succeeds in showing that the non-intellectualist must either explain why EN 1.12 should not be read as disqualifying virtuous activity as the activity of happiness or why EN 1.12 should not be given interpretive weight.

Shields's elegantly composed contribution presents a puzzle confronted by any interpretation of Aristotelian eudaimonia, intellectualist or otherwise. Aristotle rejects Plato's conception of the good as univocal -- "something common, universal and one" -- yet he holds that i) the highest good is the cause of other human goods and that ii) various good things are commensurable and thus can be ranked. Does Aristotle "fracture goodness to the point where he lacks any conception of the summum bonum sufficient to the task he sets for it"? (96) The puzzle cannot be solved by noting that Aristotle holds that a thing's good depends on its function and hence shifts from the notion of a non-indexed good to the highest-good-for-φ. Aristotle compares goodness across kinds and ranks the life of intellectual virtue above the life of ethical virtue, but without Plato's univocity assumption it seems that he cannot consistently make these comparisons. Shields exposes a "fertile tension" in Aristotle's account of the highest good, setting a worthwhile task for others to pursue (109). The whole essay is clearly argued and would be effective to teach in a seminar with advanced students.

An intriguing case for the importance of the highest good in Kant's thought is to be found in Barney's essay "The Inner Voice: Kant on Conditionality and God as Cause," which reveals Kant's account of the highest good to be "not just a logically structured exposition of a theory, but also a narrative, with a moral-educational and psychagogic dimension" (178). Barney focuses the reader's attention on a passage from the third Critique in which Kant argues that reflection leads people to the judgment that the moral quality of one's actions must make a difference to one's fortune "in the end." Although people observe that virtue goes unrewarded and vice goes unpunished in this life, "It is as if they heard an inner voice that said: This is not how it should be" (5:458, 168). Barney finds the sense in Kant's arguments for the highest good by reading them as expressions of his "intense if otherwise underarticulated commitment . . . to justice or fairness tout court" (167). She suggests that belief in the possibility of the highest good is not required to support moral motivation or secure the legitimacy of the moral law; rather, it is how we acknowledge the rationality of this "inner voice."

Barney's attention to moral phenomenology is striking. She considers the inner voice's call for proportionality of happiness and virtue "a central fact of moral experience, one to be respected by any account of the highest good," but she questions whether the postulation of God is necessary for the proper acknowledgment of this call (177). I agree that it is possible to avoid moral despair without postulating the existence of God, and I would add that it is not at all clear that the necessary proportionality that God is postulated to bring about in another world actually satisfies the inner voice. When I consider extreme undeserved suffering, it hardly seems that some kind of abstract happiness delivered "in the end" in another realm would set it right. In response to Kant's picture, my inner voice still says "This is not how it should be." Yet Barney's analysis of Kantian willing shows that we may reject Kant's version of practical faith and still appreciate that taking justice as an end requires a conception of "collaborative agency," which enables the agent to will her actions as contributions to a shared project.

Sussman's boldly titled essay "The Highest Good: Who Needs It?" also emphasizes the link between Kant's concept of the highest good and collaborative agency, though Sussman more straightforwardly recommends a secular alternative to Kant's theological conception. He argues that the highest good is not needed to solve an antinomy of practical reason, nor as a motivational crutch or aid in resisting self-deception: it "comes to look ever more like a solution desperately in search of a problem" (215). But Sussman goes on to develop an interpretation of how the highest good answers to our need for a self-conception that supports collective moral striving. Sussman draws out the social dimensions of moral self-development, highlighting the danger of treating moral striving as a personal project. His account answers the calls made in recent Kant scholarship for further attention to the relationship between moral self-perfection and sociality, and it truly moves the conversation forward. I also admire the beautifully articulated concluding remarks on Kant's failure to appreciate the human relationship to tragedy.

Both Barney and Sussman focus on elements of Kant's later thought that Bader labels as "extraneous" in his explanation for why he limits his analysis to the theory of the highest good in theCritique of Practical Reason. Bader's interest is in a systematic theory that includes only "foundational" elements of Kant's moral theory, such as the objects of practical reason and the good will. Bader contrasts virtue as an "extensive magnitude," which gauges the extent to which an agent's actions issue from a good will, to virtue as strength of will, an "intensive magnitude." He sees this alternative conception of virtue as the key to Kant's argument: it explains how the immortal soul could achieve moral perfection through an infinite series of actions that can be assessed by God as a unity. The cost of lending Kant's argument coherence in this way is quite steep, as there is little else to recommend the idea that moral virtue is to be evaluated by adding up the number of "good actions" performed by the agent and comparing this to the total number of actions. Bader relies on the problematic 'particular intention' interpretation of the good will and a somewhat crude understanding of character as an aggregate of one's choices. If having a good will means having a good moral character, as several commentators have persuasively argued, Bader's interpretation does not capture Kant's view.[3] Timmermann also focuses on an argument from the second Critique, but his reconstruction underlines the conditions that enable human beings to develop virtuous character over time through experience and education.

Bader's piece goes against the grain of some established trends in Kant scholarship, but overall I think it is a strength of this collection that it represents a range of approaches to reading historical texts and to moral theorizing. The reader may judge which methods are most fruitful. My sense is that the authors who blend interest in axiology and theoretical structure with sensitivity to ordinary moral life make the best cases for renewed attention to the highest good in Aristotle and Kant.

The various comparative insights offered in this volume cannot be easily surveyed, so I will close by highlighting just two. Barney describes Kant's conception of the highest good as "radically revisionist" in relation to the ancients, while Engstrom claims that Aristotle and Kant "belong to a common tradition of ethical thought" (160, 131). The possibility that they are both right explains why there has been such sustained interest in reading Aristotle and Kant in conversation with each other. I recommend Aufderheide and Bader's collection to those who are already part of this conversation and to those who wish to join it.

[1] Stephen Engstrom and Jennifer Whiting, ed. Aristotle, Kant and the Stoics: Rethinking Happiness and Duty (Cambridge University Press, 1996).

[2] Paula Gottlieb. The Virtue of Aristotle's Ethics (Cambridge University Press, 2009). See pages 57-59.

[3] See, for example, Jens Timmermann, Section I.1 of Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary (Cambridge University Press, 2007) and K. Ameriks, 'Kant on the Good Will', in Interpreting Kant's Critiques (Clarendon Press, 2003).