The Highway of Despair: Critical Theory After Hegel,

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Robyn Marasco, The Highway of Despair: Critical Theory After Hegel, Columbia University Press, 2015, 226pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231168663.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Flynn, Fordham University


Critical theory is committed to emancipation from domination and oppression. Despair might seem unhelpful, if not entirely antithetical, to practical and theoretical projects aimed at radically transforming society. Without hope, why participate in movements for social change? Shouldn't theorists who support such movements want to avoid despair? In this book, however, Robyn Marasco provocatively argues that critical theorists should get over the urge to provide a way out of despair. Indeed, contemporary critique can learn quite a bit, she claims, from thinkers who have theorized "at the heights of despair" (85). Such "negative passions" can "enrich the political imagination and enliven political praxis" (6).

Each of the five main chapters provides an innovative and engaging reading of one of the main figures who help make this case: Hegel, Kierkegaard, Adorno, Bataille, and Fanon. Anyone interested in any of them will profit immensely from reading Marasco's illuminating work. The close readings that move each chapter along also contribute to a larger argument about the direction contemporary critical theory should take. Critical theorists of all types will have to grapple with Marasco's challenge to travel on, rather than seek an exit from, the highway of despair. Political theorists too will have to consider her attempt to revalue the "politics of despair" (14).

Marasco situates the book within the lineage of Frankfurt School critical theory while also aiming to expand its repertoire by engaging figures like Kierkegaard, Bataille, and Fanon. Adorno is the central figure and the one through which "the book maintains its deepest connection with the radical intellectual tradition born in Frankfurt" (18). Also tying the book to this tradition is a central foil, dealt with most extensively in the "Concluding Postscript": Habermas's attempt to rescue critical theory from the despair associated with "first generation" Frankfurt School theorists, the height of which is found in Horkheimer and Adorno's Dialectic of Enlightenment. Not only is this rescue mission unnecessary, Marasco worries that "the felt need to find rescue from despair . . . is precisely what cements its hold on critical political consciousness" (31).

Hegel sets the course in Chapter 1, not as he typically might for critical theorists, as precursor to Marx or as theorist of recognition, but rather by introducing the "highway of despair." He used this phrase in the Phenomenology of Spirit to describe the course charted by "natural consciousness." Here Marasco aims to "catch a glimpse of a hidden undercurrent in the Phenomenology" (50) by viewing despair as the text's "animating force" since consciousness is "always coming undone" and thus "in principle always in despair" (52). There is a "buried idea of freedom" here too that "is found in the play of the passions" (56). Marasco admits this is an "undeveloped idea" (56) in Hegel since he explicitly thought philosophy can provide a way out of such despair. But in light of skepticism about reason providing a way out, she returns to Hegel to try to recover the "distinct pathos in dialectical thinking" (2) as a resource for critique rather than something to be evaded.

In Chapter 2, Marasco turns to Kierkegaard, no stranger to despair. In an insightful reading that I cannot do justice to here, Marasco focuses mainly on his systematic analysis of despair in The Sickness Unto Death. Both Hegel and Kierkegaard treat despair, she argues, as a dialectical passion.

Kierkegaard's fractured dialectic, like Hegel's, draws its energy from the passions that it also prohibits. He comes after Hegel in recentering the passionate side of philosophical activity. In thinking and writing at the limits of philosophy, he aims to do justice to our passions. (76)

Although there is much to be gained from his thinking on despair, Kierkegaard also inherits from Hegel the conviction that there must be a way out of despair, through faith not reason.

The idea that neither faith nor reason is up to the task sets up the transition from Part I ("Dialectics and Despair") to Part II ("Dialectical Remains"), in which Marasco engages Adorno, Bataille, and Fanon as "studies in what critical theory can do when freed from the demand that it furnish a way out of despair" (21). From each we learn "something about how to take refreshment from the dialectical quality of despair" (78).

In Chapter 3, Marasco turns to Adorno's negative dialectics. Although not uncritical, she takes Adorno's work to be the highest expression of "what is meant by critique at this historical moment" (83) and maintains that he best captures "the play of passions that accompany the restlessness of the negative" (84). In Adorno's work we get to see "some of the places critical theory is permitted to go -- the forms it takes, the postures it assumes, and the pleasures it offers -- once released to the negative" (113). This chapter also contains one of the book's most extended reflections on Marx (109-113), whose relative absence I had initially wondered about in a book subtitled Critical Theory After Hegel. Here Marasco insightfully engages an essay by Adorno titled "Resignation," which raises questions about the relation between theory and practice, the social position of theorists, antipathy toward theory, and problematic modes of "actionism" and "pseudo-activity."

While Marasco "aims to clarify how the concept of despair works in Adorno's thought," the turn to "Bataille and Fanon allow us finally to take some welcome relief from the concept" (113). In line with this transition, much of Chapter 4, on Bataille, focuses on his conception of chance and play. Only late in the chapter do we "catch a glimpse of despair in Bataille" (130) by looking at a journal entry from June 1944, in which Marasco reads Bataille as expressing

a productive desperation that demands that he study and write. Like Hegel before him and Fanon after him, Bataille presents work as our best expression of despair and our surest defense against its damages. Work, done in desperation and performed with passion, offers a fugitive freedom under inhuman conditions. (131)

The chapter then concludes with reflections on what may be surprising elements of playfulness in despair.

Chapter 5 engages both the substance of Fanon's work -- his engagement with Hegel and themes like violence, work, and struggle -- and the forms of his critique -- such as his use of the epistolary form and the role of passions. A central focal point is how Fanon's work in the clinic as a psychiatrist, along with notions of sickness and health, animates his critical theory. Ultimately, Marasco claims that "what we learn from Fanon is that critique gathers its real political force from the passions, that critical theory today demands a militant politics, and that militancy draws its strength from despair" (146).

A significant strength of the book is the welcome focus on the passions and, more specifically, negative passions. This topic has been neglected by many critical theorists, Habermas in particular. Marasco asks, "What might critical theory become if it is more attuned to the complex of passions that constitute a critical consciousness -- which is to say, might critique take refreshment from the passions, even negative passions, as a necessary supplement to reason?" (8). She makes a compelling case for the rich variety of ways that it can. But here I would note that there are two ways of thinking about this: one is analyzing the passions that constitute critical consciousness -- a critical theory of negative passions like despair; the other is critical theorists being driven by such passions in their work -- a critical theory born of despair.

Regarding the former, I would note that contemporary critical theorists like Axel Honneth have not entirely neglected the passions. Consider his account of the affective elements of recognition and the way struggles for recognition are generated by a dynamic involving negative affective responses to misrecognition.[1] Along similar lines, in light of critical theory's traditional interdisciplinary approach, it would be interesting to consider social-scientific accounts of the role of negative passions like despair in motivating or discouraging social and political struggle. My point is simply that there are additional ways in which a critical theory might focus on "negative passions."

On the nature of despair, I wonder whether Marasco is claiming that despair actually never is simply the absence of hope or that we need to pay more attention to another version of despair. The answer has implications for understanding both her critique of others for thinking despair must be avoided and her alternate path.

Another way to put this would be to distinguish what we might call "ordinary despair" -- the absence of hope we usually refer to in using the term -- from "dialectical despair." Regarding the latter, Marasco says:

despair is a dialectical passion. By this I mean that despair is at odds with itself. It militates against itself. It conserves and preserves the possibility of what it also denies. If, in etymological terms, despair indicates the absence of hope, this is no simple absence. Despair can never fully let go of its familiar and estranged other. (5)

Many of the theorists Marasco criticizes for insisting that we not fall into despair seem to be appealing to the ordinary notion (Hutchins on Hegel [46], Memmi on Fanon [145]; Habermas in general). If so, are they wrong? It seems like their mistake lies less in seeking a way out of ordinary despair and more in not seeing how despair can be understood dialectically or as a productive passion in some contexts.

Marasco's own stated worry that despair might cement its hold on critical consciousness (31) would seem to entail that it is problematic when ordinary despair takes hold. In the end, she does not seem to be saying that despair is a resource for critique insofar as it is a form of hopelessness, but rather is a resource for critique precisely because it still "conjures the spirit of hope" (16). Indeed, this is the point of distinguishing despair from pessimism (16).

How one responds to Marasco's account of despair may depend less on what one thinks of despair and more on what one thinks are the main tasks of a critical theory. Should it affirm at least some elements of social and political life or is its role primarily that of persistent questioning (8)? The latter approach is certainly in a better position to allow more room for the passion of despair. In fact, it might be more effective as critique to the extent that it does. One of Marasco's main targets is the idea that critical theorists must provide grounds for hope -- a kind of rational hope without which, allegedly, there can be no hope. When they do this, they sidestep all the critical force that can be generated by negative passions.

Marasco's endeavor to illuminate the various "forms that critical theory takes along the highway of despair" (2) is full of insights and original interpretations. Anyone interested in the power of critique will profit from this book and will have to take seriously Marasco's provocative challenge to rethink the relation between despair and critique.

[1] See Axel Honneth, Disrespect: The Normative Foundations of Critical Theory (Polity, 2007).