The History of Beyng

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Martin Heidegger, The History of Beyng, William McNeill and Jeffrey Powell (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2015, 208pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253018144.

Reviewed by Mark A. Wrathall, University of California, Riverside


This volume -- a new translation of volume 69 of the Gesamtausgabe or "Complete Edition" of Heidegger's work -- consists of two distinct parts: the manuscript of an incomplete and unpublished treatise on "The History of Beyng," and the manuscript of a short (but, to all appearances, more complete) unpublished treatise entitled "Κοινόν: Out of the History of Beyng." The two manuscripts, composed between 1938 and 1940, are closely related in terms of thematic content. In these manuscripts, we get an intimate glimpse into the development of Heidegger's account of the history of metaphysics by bringing it to bear on contemporary events. The historical phenomena that form the particular focus of Heidegger's analysis include the outbreak of the Second World War and the rise of Communism. By interrogating the ontological background of such world-historical events, Heidegger arrives at an intriguing account of the nature of power in the twentieth century.

Heidegger's reputation as a philosopher is rooted in his trenchant insights into the structure and significance of everyday modes of human life. His analytic of existence in Being and Time, for instance, depends heavily on uncovering the ontological and temporal structures of everyday phenomena like working in a carpenter's shop, riding public transportation, or discussing the latest news. For philosophers influenced by Heidegger, it is precisely his ontological perspicacity -- his ability to discern the deeper meaning and existential significance of everyday events -- that has made so perplexing his die-hard belief in German exceptionalism, his support for the National Socialist movement, and his sharing in the anti-Semitic views common in his day (a concurrence rendered no less contemptible by the peculiar ontological twist Heidegger gave to standard anti-Semitic tropes). These essays help contextualize Heidegger's failings by allowing us to follow along as he struggles to understand the broader significance of the world-shattering events of the late 1930s and early 1940s.

Heidegger argues that the phenomena that characterize any age can properly be understood only when they are seen against backdrop of historical changes in being -- in that in terms of which entities are what they are, and are how they are. Heidegger contends that Western civilization has passed through a sequence of different styles or understandings of being. This is the "history of beyng" alluded to by the title of the book. "Beyng" like the German term it translates -- "Seyn" -- is an archaic spelling for "being" ("Sein"). Heidegger began using the archaic spelling in the 1930s to mark off his own preferred, non-metaphysical notion of being. Perhaps the best way to get an initial sense for how Heidegger understands beyng is to contrast it with his characterization of the metaphysical understanding of being. Being is thought to be static, timeless, and universal. Beyng, Heidegger argues, is dynamic, historical in nature, and singular. In its account of being, metaphysical thought starts too late: it looks at the way entities have already been constituted historically, and then abstracts out from them their most generic feature to arrive at a concept of being. Being-with-an-i is a concept that, because it is so abstract and generic (necessarily applying to everything that is), is very nearly empty. Beyng, by contrast, is more original (anfänglicher) than entities. It is that which first allows entities to manifest themselves as what they are. But what could beyng be?

It is something like an attunement, operating in the background of all worldly interactions, that governs how entities can show up. Heidegger's ontology is strongly relational -- that is, what something is is a function of how it relates to other entities. That certain relations stand out as definitive and essential, while others recede in importance, is a function of the "in-between," that is, the clearing traversed by the relations that unite entities to each other so that they can mutually define each other. Beyng is that "in-between," the essential, abyssal ground of the in-between" (116) that sustains and structures relations. One is tempted to think of the background that allows entities to show up in the foreground as having a kind of "texture." It is not an inert nothing, an "indeterminate emptiness into which something 'appears'" (123). Instead it attunes us to entities and entities to each other in a particular way.

These manuscripts explore this claim by offering an interpretation of the world-historical events of the era. What I have called the "texture" of the background that shapes everything in the contemporary world is, Heidegger argues, power. He interprets contemporary events as "traces" or indications of an underlying change in the being of entities, and a corresponding change in the character of human existence. In particular, he sees in the rise of power politics, the normalization of war, race-thinking, and communism, indications that the background texture of our world is changing in fundamental and distressing ways.

In these manuscripts, then, we can follow along as Heidegger works out an account of "power" as "an essencing of beyng" (eine Wesung des Seyns; see, e.g., 55, translation modified) -- as the way that beyng determines the essence of all the entities that show up in our world. Heidegger's concept of power here is heavily indebted to his interpretation of Nietzsche's discussion of the will to power, according to which Nietzsche was the thinker who first and most clearly grasped the emergence in our age of a new form of power. The essence of this new form of power "does not only lie in . . . the capacity for domination that has at its disposal the means of all forces" (158; translation modified). The old fashioned view of power (according to which power means having the force at one's disposal to exert dominion within a sphere) fails to grasp what's truly essential about power in our age.

Heidegger argues that the emerging form of power (the kind of power which increasingly structures the background against which entities appear) involves two aspects:

1. power drives constantly toward the "overpowering of each attained level of power" (54);


2. power involves "the exclusion of every outside that is not itself;" it "alone determin[es] the essence of beings" (54).

The second aspect means that previous mechanisms for restraining the use of power -- appeals to ethics, morality, law and justice, for instance -- will no longer carry weight: "where power becomes historical as the essence of being, all morality and legality are banished, and indeed unconditionally. Power is neither moral nor immoral, it unfolds its power outside of morality, law, and custom" (66). Eventually, Heidegger predicts, power will "unconditionally shatter" every value or ideal which might be used to restrain power. At that point, power will no longer answer to any imperative other than that of "the unceasing exceeding of each attained level of power" (56).

In a world organized by such an imperative, we will no longer experience ourselves, our purpose in life, and the entities around us in terms of the "standards or goals or motivations belonging to humankind hitherto" (23). In its consummate form -- Heidegger calls it "machination" (see 41) -- power will so thoroughly pervade the world that everything will show up as infinitely "malleable" or "makeable." In a world decisively ordered in accordance with machination, we will be able to reconfigure entities in any way that we want, and order them in such a way as to maximize our options for use: "everything becomes ever more new and ever more rapidly new" (130). A reader familiar with Heidegger's later work will recognize this analysis of machination as an incipient form of his later description of the way technology "unlocks" and "exposes" and "switches about ever anew" all entities, reducing them to resources.

With the "inexorable retraction of every possibility of determining power by way of something that it itself is not" (157), we will experience as intolerable any restrictions on our ability to constantly expand, develop, experiment with life, and overcome old restraints. Then the emerging kind of power will enter its consummate form. Heidegger's vision of the end state of power anticipates in intriguing ways Foucault's much later account of the rise of biopower. As old, "outside" aims or goals of existence lose their grip on us, Heidegger argues that

the human being today . . . is entering that cluelessness that vacillates in all directions and that now allows him only to be on the lookout for "goals" that are supposed to exceed what has gone before . . . beyond the cultivation of competence and the pleasurable aspect of bodily life there remains nothing more than the unconditional expansion of this "goal" to the entire mass of humans who find pleasure and health, are industrialized and technicized and make culture, in a process that continually registers the intensification of these life interests anew (175).

The consummate form of power, then, will be a condition in which the world is secured as a repository of multitudinous available possible ways to pursue a flourishing life, none of which is any higher or more sacred than another.

But Germany and the world in the 1930s was not yet in a consummate stage of power. In the then-prevailing initial phase of the "overpowering" of power, Heidegger explains, things will appear quite different. Initially, power will resort to violence to "transpose beings into the domain of power" (64). That is, as long as people and entities are guided by an "outside" imperative, it will take compulsion to break them down and reorient them, fitting them into the power domain that aims only at multiplying options and maximizing flexibility. Of course, if people are still committed to such external sources of mattering, power will need a pretext to justify the violent reorganization of the world. That pretext is served by political factions or "interests" who "parade various 'ideals' before them in each case, ideals whose desirability spurs on the need for power" (159). Heidegger believes that every appeal to "social justice," the "progress of culture," "the saving of western 'culture'," the "new 'world order'," or any "political system" (65) is in fact a means exploited by power to undermine our will to resist the emerging reorganization of the world. "Power needs the public," Heidegger muses, "but with the intent of confusing it through and through, and of undermining the possibility of forming an opinion. The result of this confusion is complete indifference toward everything" (71).

Initially, Heidegger speculates, power will be concentrated and used by individual dictators and political factions. But ultimately, "power tolerates no possessors" (165) and thus eventually "undermines . . . dictatorship, because the latter brings with it a petrification at one level of power and excludes itself from the open realm of the unconditional" (162).

One cannot emphasize clearly enough that Heidegger in no way endorses or approves of either the ultimate "empowering of power" or the initial rise of machination, characterized as it is by wars, the rise of totalitarian regimes, and "struggles for world power." He condemns it unequivocally as an "annihilation," a "devastation," a "laying 'waste" that amounts to an "undermining of every possibility of any decision and of all domains of decisions" (43). After all, it is in the possibility of genuine decision, rather than mere choosing from the options that the world of machination provides, that Heidegger finds our highest human "dignity." "Thought in its essence," Heidegger insists, "dignity remains so decisively alien to power that it may not even be posited as its opposite" (65).

Indeed, one finds in these manuscripts perhaps some of Heidegger most direct condemnations of German nationalism and National Socialism1 -- movements that he had embraced in the early 1930s, but now regards as tools or means exploited by power to break down meaningful ideals and commitments that would lead to resistance to consummate machination. "Nationalism of the people and socialism of the people," Heidegger argues, is merely "a claim to power . . . asserted for the sake of power itself" (40). Heidegger mocks the ideology of struggle, Kampf, as "power-technological violent suppression, for the sake of power, in which process 'goals' merely play the role of means for power" (56; translation modified). He sees through the cynicism of Nazi projects of racial breeding and racial hygiene, explaining that the emphasis on "racial hygiene is a measure in keeping with power. It can therefore be deployed at one moment and put on hold the next . . . It is by no means an 'ideal' in itself" (60). The glorification of the people (das Volk), and the "splendor and showmanship" of Nazi pageantry likewise are regarded as tools to confuse, distract, and draw people away from any commitments that would impair the constant overcoming of power:

The point is simply a form of social order that grants unconditional rule. This permeating of the people by power, who are publically declared to be the sole bearers of the will, is a preemptive and unconditional disempowering. It belongs to it that it act precisely without splendor, without the many forms of ostentation, without becoming entangled in mere institutions on account of the greatest possible wretchedness. To the possession of power and its display there belong splendor and din; to the essence of power and its own securing there belongs the greatest wretchedness. This wretchedness requires an extensive superficiality of thought. It is best served by thoughtlessness (70).

"The most honest struggle to save freedom and ethical life," Heidegger concludes as he assesses the contemporary conditions in Nazi-era Germany, "serves only to maintain and increase a possession of power whose powerfulness will not tolerate being questioned, because the preeminence of power as the being of beings has already seized power over morality and its defense as an essential means of power" (156). Power itself uses "the saving of national traditions (Volkstümer) and the securing of one's 'eternal' racial survival as supreme goals" (156, translation modified). The "positing of these same goals (the securing of 'morality,' the saving of 'völklisch substance") is nevertheless always something belated that remains unknowingly and unintentionally placed into the service of the empowering of power" (156). A consistent theme running through The History of Beyng, in other words, is that the goals of Nazi regime serve ultimately to demoralize the German people, confuse them and make them indifferent, thereby weaning them from any commitments that would stifle the endless process of overpowering power.

Sadly, it would be a mistake to read such critical comments directed at the Nazi regime as a sign that Heidegger had shaken free of his anti-Semitic views or his hostility to Western liberal democracy. For starters, Heidegger never seriously entertains the possibility that traditional moralities or legal structures could withstand the onslaught of the emerging age of consummate power. "One can be filled with moral indignation," Heidegger muses, "yet one must know that this is not a response that is commensurate with power. Nor can a retreat to the moral ever fathom the ground of this essence of truth . . . or prepare an overcoming. With the aid of morality, one can only evade, and that means, exclude oneself from history, which proceeds via the unleashing of the essence of power into machination" (68). The complete overpowering of all "outside" sources of meaning, Heidegger claims, is something that cannot be stopped but must be gone through.

Heidegger goes on to treat Western "parliamentary" democracies as on a par with the totalitarian regimes in Germany and Russia. The "reciprocal judging and condemning of fundamental political positions," Heidegger argues, "also belongs to the form of their implementation of power. Yet it also prevents essential insight into the metaphysical sameness . . . of these modern configurations of the political implementation of power" (160-1). British parliamentary democracy, in other words, is metaphysically the same as the Nazi or Soviet regime because each of them, in their own way, is exploiting their people's adherence to "values" to justify the expansion of power. Any use of power, Heidegger suggests, can be rationalized when "one's own illusory essence become[s] inflated into the role of savior of morality" (177). Heidegger thus, quite cynically, criticizes the "immense deception" perpetrated by "the modern English state" which, "in the semblance of morality and the education of peoples makes all implementation of power harmless and self-evident" (176). His considered view seems to be that appeals to, on the one hand, democracy, morality, legality and human rights and, on the other hand, racial hygiene or nationalism are merely "reciprocally opposing sides [of] the walls of pretext behind which pure power exerts itself" (132).

Worst of all, rather than seeing the Jewish people as victims of the initial, violent phase of empowering, Heidegger suggests that "one would have to ask what are the grounds that peculiarly predetermine the Jewish community for planetary criminality" (66). By "planetary criminality," he refers to the process of the annihilation of meaningful differences that accompanies power's destruction of all outside orders. He thus blames the most visible victims of power for the condition of moral devastation that leads to their genocide.

Heidegger is a notoriously difficult author to translate. He uses ordinary German words in extraordinary ways, creates neologisms, and makes extensive use of families of words built on common roots. Preserving these features of Heidegger's prose in translation is, to say the least, a challenge. Many a well-intentioned translator has produced nearly unintelligible renditions of Heidegger's work in English. William McNeill and Jeffrey Powell are thus to be commended for this translation. It is clear, straightforward, and remains close to Heidegger's original German. My only complaint is that they tend, unnecessarily in my view, to use a multiplicity of different English terms or phrases to translate a single term of Heidegger's German. For instance, Heidegger's Wesung is best translated as "essencing," and that's how McNeill and Powell do translate it in many instances. But they also use a number of other constructions, including "prevailing of the essence," "essential presencing," and "essential unfolding." In every instance, the text would read just as well, if not better, with the simplest alternative ("essencing"). Similarly, Heidegger's central concept of Herrschaft is rendered in translation by (among others) "dominance," "rule," "sovereignty," and "dominion" -- four quite distinct philosophical concepts. Here again, the translation would not have suffered by choosing a single alternative and sticking with it, allowing the reader to track better Heidegger's development of the concept in the course of the text. As it is, one can easily miss the fact that a single notion is in play in different passages of the book.

On the whole, finally, The History of Beyng is an intriguing and paradoxical text. It will not resolve the ongoing argument about whether or to what extent Heidegger's philosophy was irredeemably marred by his prejudices and his involvement with Nazism. But it does provide important insight into the evolving nature of his relationship to the German regime. There are also many tantalizing indications of how Heidegger in the 1930s thought the ontological devastation of machination and overpowering power could be resisted (I don't have space to discuss this, but Heidegger seems to advocate a form of ontological nonviolent resistance). At its best, Heidegger's historical reflection cuts through to the essential core of superficially quite disparate phenomena and offers genuine insight. At its worst, it becomes infuriatingly superficial or even offensive (as when he equates the Nazi regime with democratic Britain). For all that, the manuscripts offer an important, relatively concrete (by Heidegger's standards) discussion of the phenomenology of ontological transformation. His account of the history of beyng is put to the test by its ability to provide insight into the most important social and political events of his day -- including the rise of fascism and communism in Europe, the outbreak of global wars, and the horrific genocidal turn of anti-Semitic hostilities in Germany. This makes the book essential reading for anyone interested in Heidegger's later work.

1One can also find a number of passages in the notorious Black Notebooks where he confesses to having misjudged the true significance of National Socialism. See, for example, GA95: 408.