The Household as the Foundation of Aristotle's Polis

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D. Brendan Nagle, The Household as the Foundation of Aristotle's Polis, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 364pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521849349.

Reviewed by Robert Mayhew, Seton Hall University


In a sense, The Household as the Foundation of Aristotle's Polis tells us what we already know: that the household (oikos) plays a crucial role in the political philosophy of Aristotle. But Brendan Nagle tells us this in an original way, and with a wealth of detail pertaining to the historical context within which Aristotle worked.

The task of the first chapter -- "Ancient and Modern Households" -- is to make clear in what way, and to what extent, "The polis household analyzed by Aristotle in his Politics and Ethics had little in common with the households of contemporary developed states" (p. 1), and Nagle fulfills this task admirably. The second chapter -- "The Polis as Community and Polity" -- is a brief (and preliminary) sketch of the nature of the polis (or city) and Aristotle's views on the relationship between the household and the polis.

Perhaps the best chapters in the book are the next two: 3. "Polis Households: Possessions," and 4. "Polis Households: Labor Needs of the Oikos." Both are required reading for anyone hoping to better understand the historical and cultural context of Aristotle's political philosophy. Chapter 3 deals with "the material needs of the household in both existing states and in Aristotle's ideal state," while Chapter 4 covers "the labor needs of these households" (p. 32). What Nagle makes clear is that the data concerning poleis that Aristotle had to work with was vast, that the range of different types of poleis was very broad, and that Athens was certainly not Aristotle's model for all poleis (Aristotle was not "Athenocentric," p. 54).

On the size of Aristotle's model polis, Nagle concludes: "I am inclined to think that the modal [sic, "model"?] poleis of, say, Stagira or Aphytis or any of those in the Chalcidice … or Asea in Arcadia, were close to Aristotle's idea of the Normalpolis" (p. 74). In the conclusion, he sums up his findings: "Aristotle's ideal state would have had a territory of about 60 km2 with a population of 500 to 1000 households, that is, about 2% to 3% the size of Athens" (p. 312). The average household in such a city would be about 12 hectares (30 acres). "It would supply sufficient wine, oil, grain, legumes, fruit, milk for daily living, and meat on occasion. It possessed a slave or two." (p. 75) (One may wonder how this last point can be reconciled with the following line from Politics 7.4: "presumably, cities must have large numbers of slaves" [1326a18-19].)

Chapter 4 contains a useful discussion of Aristotle's views on slavery, including why he thinks that there is a necessary connection between the household and slavery, and who precisely Aristotle has in mind when he speaks of the natural slave. I have a couple of problems with the discussion. First, Nagle follows Darryl Dobbs and David Depew in holding that according to Aristotle, natural slaves "are not … born but created" (p. 111). (I think this is correct in general, though I don't think Aristotle ruled out the possibility of some humans being born slaves.) From this premise, Nagle argues:

If natural slavery were the product of environment rather than genetics, then, presumably, when natural slaves were removed from their detrimental environments and transported to a good environment, to a well-functioning, healthy polis, such individuals would have the opportunity to grow out of their slavishness. (pp. 111-12)

But this does not follow. It could be that according to Aristotle, if one does not receive in childhood the proper instruction and habituation required for becoming a freeman, then one's disposition as natural slave is set -- say, if one has lived as a natural slave for his first 25 years. Moreover, I see no evidence that reversing the state of slavery in an individual was a concern of Aristotle's (though if Nagle is right, this would help make sense of a difficult passage at Politics 7.10.1330a31-33 about holding out to slaves the promise of freedom).

Nagle raises a number of questions about the deliberative abilities of barbarians, which is important for understanding Aristotle's conception of slavery. I think Nagle might have been better able to answer these questions had he devoted more attention to answering this one (which he merely raises): "What of barbarian poleis like Carthage, which is used by Aristotle as an example of a well-run state?" (p. 115). Aristotle devotes an entire chapter to Carthage (Politics 2.11), and I think he makes it clear that such barbarians are perfectly capable of deliberation (or to use Nagle's own language, a barbarian's deliberative capacity -- whether perfect or impoverished -- is not born but created).

So far, Nagle has been discussing polis-households -- households which are by their nature intimately connected to the polis of which they are a part. Chapter 5 ("Non-Polis Households") examines two kinds of households not connected to poleis: the households characteristic of authoritarian regimes (like Persia, which is not a polis), and the solitary, pre-political households characteristic of the Cyclopes discussed by Homer in Odyssey 9 -- neither of which allows for proper human development. Nagle devotes more space to the latter, and he ends the chapter with a section entitled "Slavery and the Non-Polis Household." Still, however interesting and useful this discussion, there was the potential for making even more connections between the solitary non-polis households and Aristotle's conviction that there are by nature severe problems and limitations with (most) barbarian cultures -- a discussion which could in turn shed light on the intersecting issue of barbarians and slavery.

The perfection of the household is the city. For instance, Aristotle says that justice exists in the city but not (or not really or fully) in the household. Of course, the household exists within the city and assists humans in becoming or being complete or perfect. This assistance is the topic of Chapter 6, "The Perfection of the Household." Nagle is here especially interested in the role of women, and his discussion of the role of women in the household (pp. 158-75) is quite good. Nagle clearly wants to present Aristotle as sympathetically as possible, and he is able to do so by underscoring women's contribution to the city through their household functions. But I should point out that this discussion is rooted in how he takes Aristotle's infamous claim that the woman possesses the deliberative capacity (to bouletikon) but that it lacks authority (akuron) (Politics 1.13.1260a13).

My own belief is based on the assumption that involvement in the public realm of civic and military affairs was necessary for the development, even if incomplete, of the cardinal virtues. The public arena provided both information for deliberation and the opportunity for the citizen to habituate himself in its exercise… . Women's deficient deliberative capacity was simply the result of a lack of opportunity. It was compensated for only partially by women's important role in public religious affairs. (p. 169)

This assumption, though it has had its supporters, is not defended by Nagle, but simply stated. (For what it's worth, I think the assumption is false.)

Chapter 7 -- "Philia as Bond between Oikos and Polis" -- elaborates on the connection between the city and the households within it. Aristotle is a pretty typical Greek on this connection, and although the chapter is both necessary and useful, there is not much that's new here. In Chapter 8 -- Plato's Paideia -- Nagle takes a step back to the more radical outlook of Plato. In the language of A.W. Price, for Aristotle (contra Plato), "Household becomes to city not stumbling-block, but building-brick" (Love and Friendship in Plato and Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 1990, p. 193). I turned to this chapter expecting a detailed discussion of Plato's abolition of the household (in the Republic) and how this contributes to making Plato's political philosophy radically different from Aristotle's. Instead, the discussion focuses (as the chapter-title indicates) on education. The reason Nagle's focus did not match my expectations is made clear fairly early: he believes that the Platonic abolition of the household applies to the ruling class of the Republic alone, whereas "the kind of household in which the Producer Class, that is, the vast majority of Kallipolitans, lived was the same kind of household in which most Greek polis dwellers lived" (p. 205). (Note that Aristotle did not think this was clear. See Politics 2.5.1264a11-17.) Wherever one stands on this issue, however, Plato did regard the entire city (of the Republic) as one big household in the following sense: in the form of rule the Philosopher-Kings exerted over the citizens of the Republic, which was no different from household rule or even rule over slaves. This marks a big difference between Plato and Aristotle (see Republic 9.590c‑d and Politics 1.1. 1252a7-16), one that should have been mentioned.

Chapter 8 contains a long excursion (entitled "An Incidental Education: Paideia in the World of the Polis"). The "basic argument" of this section (which Nagle admits "is not novel") is "that the principal education of the vast majority of Greeks -- men, women, and children, elite and non-elite, rich and poor -- was incidental" (p. 221). This discussion is interesting and important. My only complaint is that it was stuck at the end of the chapter on Plato, when it should have been a chapter of its own, perhaps located before the material on Plato. In any case, particularly interesting is the discussion of female paideia (pp. 234-45, which includes eleven photographic reproductions of relevant vase paintings, depicting, for example, women reading or teaching girls to dance).

In the next chapter, Nagle writes:

The strength of the oikos, rather than its weakness, provoked Plato's de-householding plan for his ideal city in the Republic. Aristotle, taking a more pragmatic view of the oikos, sought means to improve rather than abolish it. His formal school program was, I will argue, structured to complement the resources of the oikos and supplement its deficiencies rather than strengthen the power of the state over it. (p. 250)

This is what the author attempts to demonstrate in Chapter 9, "Aristotle's Paideia" (and he does so fairly successfully, I believe).

There is a 20-page conclusion, a bibliography, and an index (but alas, no index locorum). Overall, this is a clear and well-written book. I encountered very few typos (a major one on p. 250: "Xenophon's Isocrates" should be "Xenophon's Ischomachus") and a misuse of "beg the question" (instead of "raise the question") on p. 81 (though this usage is becoming increasingly common in the United States).

As reviewers often do, I have, in describing the content of this book, elaborated more often on aspects of it that I find flawed. So let me make clear in closing that I think The Household as the Foundation of Aristotle's Polis is an important book that should be read by anyone interested in Aristotle's political philosophy.