The Idea of Form: Rethinking Kant's Aesthetics

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Gasche, Rodolphe, The Idea of Form: Rethinking Kant's Aesthetics, Stanford University Press, 2003, 256pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804746214.

Reviewed by Rachel Zuckert , Rice University


Gasché offers here a comprehensive discussion of Kant’s aesthetics in the Critique of Judgment, tracing Kant’s account as it unfolds from the placement of pure judgments of taste within the general doctrine of reflective judgment in the published and unpublished introductions to the CJ, through the characterizations of judgments of taste and of sublimity, to the claim that beauty is the “symbol of morality,” with which the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment concludes. His discussion focuses, however, on the two themes announced in his title: Kant’s aesthetic formalism and (via the technical meaning of “idea”) the “crucial role played by reason in the formation and judgment of form” (p. 12).

Gasché argues that one ought to read Kant’s formalism not as a claim that in a pure judgment of taste we appreciate “surface” characteristics of an object such as line or composition, but as the claim that in aesthetic judging we apprehend the “mere form of an object” as such, as “minimally cognizable.” Following Béatrice Longuenesse, Gasché argues that our apprehension of such form is an act of “mere” reflection “isolated” from its role within our usual, “reflective but also determinative,” conceptually guided acts of judgment that render objects and experience possible. The (successful) engagement in such “mere” reflection is pleasurable, for it is a “precognitive” or “para-epistemic” achievement that renders “wild,” unconceptualized objects “minimally” comprehensible.

Gasché’s treatment of the role of reason in Kant’s aesthetics touches on many of Kant’s suggestions concerning the relationship between aesthetics and morality (or practical reason). More controversially, drawing upon Kant’s infrequently discussed account of the “Ideal of Beauty” in paragraph 17 and upon that of aesthetic ideas in Kant’s account of fine art, Gasché argues that the “para-epistemic” apprehension of form in aesthetic judgment is, itself, already guided by and directed towards reason’s “idea of a maximum” and our rational aims to cognize particular objects, or nature, as systematic wholes. The “prodigality” of beautiful form, the “luxuriance” of the ideas produced by the imagination in aesthetic experience are symbolic emulations of rational totality and systematicity, just as in the experience of the (mathematical) sublime, on Kant’s view, the imagination, in aiming to comprehend a large sensible object, aims also to represent sensibly the rational idea of infinity. Thus Gasché draws unusually strong parallels between pure judgments of taste concerning natural beauty, judgments of art as expressing aesthetic ideas, and aesthetic judgments of the sublime: all of these judgments are apprehensions of the “minimal cognizability” of “wild” or unconceptualized objects and are experiences of the “life of the mind,” oriented by and symbolic of the overarching aims of reason, and “conducive,” “beneficial” or “enlivening” to the exercise of our rational capacities as a whole.

This book contains a number of provocative suggestions, most prominently this last, that Kant’s judgments of the beautiful and the sublime might both be read primarily as sensible symbolizations of rationality. Gasché’s background in literary theory and criticism is demonstrated in interesting discussions of particular passages or locutions in Kant’s text. For example, in Gasché’s early essay, “Hypotyposis” (reprinted in this volume), he suggests that Kant’s denigration of rhetoric (in his hierarchical discussion of the fine arts) should be reinterpreted in light of his use of the classical rhetorical figure of “hypotyposis” to characterize beauty as a symbol of morality. And, drawing upon lexicographical research, he argues that Kant’s usage of “mere” (bloss) to qualify the a priori in the CJ, by contrast to “pure” (rein) in the other two critiques, indicates the fragility and elusiveness of the a priori principle of reflection and of taste: “mere” reflection does not generate a fixed, self-sufficient body of a priori knowledge (by contrast to the understanding’s “pure” principles or the “pure” principle of practical reason) but is identifiable only by contrast to what it “excludes,” that from which it is “isolated” (determinate, empirical, contentful knowledge of objects). More broadly, though not “thematized” by Gasché as a tension, Gasché’s characterization of the pure judgment of aesthetic form as both a “minimal” or “precognitive” grasp of the object and as a maximal grasp of the “luxuriance” of an object’s characteristics beyond (“para”) determinate cognition identifies an interesting, underdiscussed tension in Kant’s description of our apprehension of beauty, and in its “systematic” placement with respect to cognitive understanding, as both less and more than empirical knowledge.

Gasché has, however, much more ambitious aims: he writes that he has sought “to avoid … a critical debate with the various and often contradictory interpretations” of the CJ and promises that “[a]s a result of [his] reading, many of the so-called inconsistencies and puzzles that commentators have enjoyed pointing out … will appear … less problematic”; on his reading, Kant provides a “highly consistent set of strong arguments” in the CJ (p. 11). And indeed, Gasché cites very little Anglo-American or German scholarship; he does not even mention such prominent readers of this text as Cristel Fricke, Jens Kuhlenkampff, or Paul Guyer. Instead of scholarly debate, Gasché writes in the style of some European commentary, using extensive, narrative paraphrase of the text, liberally interspersed with textual quotations. This style of commentary, at its best, can (re)orient the reader’s sense of a text’s structure and central concerns, as Gasché does, in beginning his Critique of Aesthetic Judgment, with the “third moment” in Kant’s account of the judgment of taste. On Gasché’s reading, the justificatory questions concerning the universal yet subjective validity of the claims of taste posed in the first two moments (and ultimately addressed in Kant’s deduction of judgments of taste) that preoccupy most commentators on the CJ –and, arguably, Kant himself—take second place to Kant’s descriptive aesthetics of form and of “boundless” formlessness (in the sublime) and to the systematic importance of Kant’s identification of the “transcendental” status of taste.

Without further analysis and reconstruction, the paraphrastic form of commentary is, however, insufficient to clarify the frequently obscure and puzzling claims of the CJ, much less allay philosophical worries concerning the strength of the arguments there presented. For example, Gasché suggests that on Kant’s view we can and do judge works of art – as well as natural beauties – in “pure” judgments of taste, on the basis of their “mere form.” For, Gasché argues, though we do judge these objects in terms of concepts (and thus would appear precisely not to be judging them in terms of Gasché’s “mere,” unconceptualized form), the concepts by which we judge art works have been “rendered indeterminate” by the genius, who transforms them into aesthetic ideas that contain “more” than can be determinately, conceptually articulated; thus, our appreciation of such ideas is identical (?) to our appreciation of the “luxuriance” of natural beautiful form. Leaving aside difficulties (often discussed in the scholarship, but not mentioned here) concerning which kind of concept is employed, on Kant’s view, in such judgments (representation? painting? post-Impressionist painting? sunflower, vase, or table? the vibrancy, terror, or fragility of life?), Gasché’s elaboration of many different possible meanings of “form” in Kant’s discussion of the arts—from “academic” form as necessary technique for artistic production (which, as Gasché writes, is “utterly distinct” from Kant’s usage of “form” elsewhere in the CJ [p. 189]), to an expression “adequate” to the genius’ thought (p. 190), to arrangement, composition or delineation (p. 192), to success at representation of a thing or the “form of thing” (p. 193)—does not persuade the reader that appreciation of aesthetic ideas or artistic beautiful form is similar to appreciation of natural form. This elaboration tends, rather, to render the Kantian concept of form itself—already elusive in Kant, and on Gasché’s presentation—indeterminate.

There are also terminological and textual imprecisions in Gasché’s discussion that will irritate scholars and may frustrate or mislead students looking for elucidation of this difficult text. For example, in arguing (rightly) that natural, not artistic, beauty is central to Kant’s aesthetics, Gasché repeatedly emphasizes Kant’s claim that in order to be beautiful, art must look like nature, but usually fails to quote, and does not remark upon, Kant’s appended claim that beautiful nature looks like art (CJ Ak. V: 306). Likewise, in discussing Kant’s claims in the “Ideal of Beauty” that we must produce an ideal representation of reason’s idea of a maximum as a standard for taste, Gasché asserts that “[f]or the most part, Kant remains silent, in chapter 17, about how to conceive of such an ideal” (p. 106). This assertion is, at the least, highly puzzling, since Kant devotes most of paragraph 17 to arguing that the sole ideal of beauty is the representation of a (particular sort of) human form (a claim that Gasché ducks, as requiring “extensive discussion,” a page earlier). And, more centrally, in discussing the relationship between Kant’s frequent denials in the CJ that the judgment of taste involves conceptual determination of objects, and his doctrines in the Critique of Pure Reason—how can Kant of all philosophers claim that we find objects (somehow) intelligible without any conceptualization?— Gasché suggests that aesthetic experience concerns objects characterized indeed by the a priori “form of a phenomenon” promulgated in the CPR, for which, however, we lack empirical concepts (pp. 72-3). But Gasché’s glosses here (and throughout the book) -- “a reflective aesthetic judgment takes place in the absence of any concept that would unify … the … manifold … before all logical determination, before all representation through which the object is thought” [my emphasis]—are imprecise, given that the “form of phenomena” of the CPR is, of course, conceptually determined by the categories. (It is also not helpful to most current readers of the CJ that Gasché cites page numbers not from the Akademie edition, but from an old translation [Bernard], which makes textual double-checking onerous.)

Though Gasché’s aim to eschew the arcana of extensive scholarly debate is understandable and perhaps even commendable, his discussion might have been clarified by some attention (and response, even if not in the form of scholarly debate) to the “puzzles” raised by commentators on the CJ. One of the stronger discussions in this work is in the opening of chapter 3, where Gasché argues against the standard interpretation of Kant’s aesthetic formalism that it is based, questionably, solely on paragraph 14, entitled “Elucidation by Examples” (where Kant famously, or notoriously, glosses form as “line” or “shape”), to the exclusion of the other, theoretically more central paragraphs in the “third moment.” Gasché suggests, interestingly, that one ought to understand this paragraph as Kant’s address to art critics (e.g., of the Winckelmann school), an attempt to draw upon their conception of form in order to encourage them to endorse his own, ultimately rather different conception of aesthetic form. Likewise, readers from the post-structuralist tradition may find Gasché’s sympathetic characterization of the role of reason within Kant’s aesthetics, in conversation with Lyotard’s and Derrida’s readings of the CJ and his defense of Kant against the charge of promoting a “double” aesthetics (of beauty and sublimity), helpful.

Similar attention to, and argument against, opposing positions in the scholarship might have sharpened some of the unsatisfying discussion elsewhere in this work. Thus, for example, Gasché’s glosses on Kant’s denials of conceptual determination in judgments of taste—that they occur “only when” the subject is faced by objects “for which no determined [empirical] concepts are available,” (p. 3)—might allow Gasché to defend Kant against the familiar objection that on his view we ought to find all objects beautiful. (The recent essay by Dorit Barchana Lorand in Kant-Studien, however, endorses a somewhat similar line of interpretation with greater philosophical acuity in response to such difficulties.) But Kant is hereby rendered vulnerable to another familiar problem, that he seems to be committed to a deeply implausible view that our experiences of beautiful objects are very few and far between: if we can find an object beautiful only if we have no determinate (empirical) concept for it, then roses, tulips, gardens, paintings, and people cannot be found beautiful (except by young children). Since these are not only among the kinds of objects we actually tend to find beautiful but also among Kant’s favored examples of beautiful objects, some more precise articulation of the kind of concept that is absent in judgments of taste, or the way in which such judgments are not based upon concepts, or the meaning of Kant’s category of “dependent” or “accessory” beauty (judgments of which do involve determinate concepts, on Kant’s view)—beyond the assertion that concepts are “lacking” or “not available”—is required. Gasché offers us the interesting item of information that at Kant’s time, tulips were new to Europe, and considered “wild”; this, however, does not show that Kant (or other Europeans) had no concept, “tulip,” nor does it help us understand the possibility of the judgment, “This rose is beautiful.”

Gasché’s work identifies promising directions for thinking about the Third Critique. His emphases upon rational systematicity in relation to taste and upon Kant’s doctrines in the “third moment”—from the claims concerning beautiful form to the doctrine of the ideal of beauty—are welcome, since these are, arguably, the most frequently criticized or ignored among Kant’s central doctrines in the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. And Gasché’s work takes up a position that might span the gaps between continental, literary-critical, analytic, and historical treatments of the CJ. This work will not, I fear, convince doubters on these counts, but it may, I hope, prompt further, cross-disciplinary discussion of reason and form in Kant’s rich and puzzling philosophical aesthetics.