The Idea of Hegel's Science of Logic

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Stanley Rosen, The Idea of Hegel's Science of Logic, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 509pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226065885.

Reviewed by Robert M. Wallace, Independent Scholar


I believe that Stanley Rosen's new book combines comprehensive exegesis and philosophical penetration more successfully than any other study so far published on Hegel'sScience of Logic (SL). No one who is seriously interested in Hegel can afford to neglect Rosen's book. I will outline the book's major theses and accomplishments and conclude with a couple of significant criticisms.

Hegel's Science of Logic (1812-16) is less widely discussed than his first major work, the Phenomenology of Spirit (PS) (1807). The PS combines an intricate argument with dramatic discussions of master and bondsman, Sophocles's Antigone, and the Terror in the French Revolution. The Science of Logic, on the other hand, is the foundation of the philosophical "system" of Logic, Nature, and Spirit, which Hegel went on to elaborate in his Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (1817 and thereafter), leaving it unclear just how necessary the "introduction" to the system that he had earlier presented in the PS might be. If one takes Hegel's mature "system" seriously, one will obviously have to study carefully the SL, which sets the pattern for the rest of it.

And that, of course, is the rub. Just how seriously can we take Hegel's breathtakingly ambitious "system," and its very challenging initial part? A book that describes itself as outlining "God as he is in his eternal essence before the creation of nature and a finite mind," as Hegel puts it in the Introduction to the SL, is certainly bound to encounter skepticism.

Rosen has no interest in soft-pedaling Hegel's apparent theological claims, as many recent promoters of a "non-metaphysical" or essentially Kantian Hegel have wanted to do. Rosen takes Hegel's statements about "God" at face value, not as referring to God as commonly understood, but as referring to something that deserves the eminence traditionally assigned to God.

Rosen does this because he agrees with Hegel that modern thought and modern life in general are in deep trouble, and require what may seem to be pretty drastic measures to save them. We are constantly threatened by "the nihilism of multiple and mutually exclusive partial views, perspectives, interpretations, or opinions about human life" (72). This amounts to "chaos." To overcome it, we must find "intelligibility" in the world and our experience. The effort of western philosophy since Anaxagoras and Socrates has been precisely to find such intelligibility, and Hegel, as Rosen interprets him, aims to continue and consummate this effort.

Rosen agrees with Hegel that the major effort of Immanuel Kant to this same end was unsuccessful, inasmuch as Kant located intelligibility not in the world as such, but only in the categories by which the transcendental subject thinks the world. Hegel's aim is to find intelligibility in the world or in being as such, and thus to bridge the gulf between subject and object which Kant had failed to bridge.

"Logic," as Hegel understands the term, includes the study of valid inference but a great deal more as well, because it unfolds the basic categories of all reality. It does this as the study of logos, of the "word" or "reason" in the broadest sense, which since Heraclitus and the Gospel of John has been understood as the structure of reality. So Logic is the discipline that addresses the issue of finding intelligibility in reality as a whole.

So as to show that reality or being as such must be intelligible, Hegel proposes to begin the study of Logic with being as such. But as Rosen mentions (95), Hegel in fact allows that one could equally well begin with "nothing," because in both cases one winds up with a differentiated unity of being and nothing. This is because, as Hegel says in the famous first chapter of the SL's first section, being as such is "undetermined and empty," there is nothing to perceive or think in it, so it is "in fact nothing." And nothing, on the other hand, is equally undetermined and empty, there is nothing to perceive or think in it, and thus it's the same as we saw being was. But surely being and nothing are opposites, Hegel says, "absolutely different" from each other. And thus what's truly present here is "the immediate disappearance of each into the other," or "coming into being" and "ceasing to be," which he sums up together as "becoming." This "becoming" in turn presupposes what Rosen calls "identifiable elements" (127) that come into being or cease to be, elements that Hegel himself refers to as Dasein (often translated as "determinate being").

Rosen provides an elegant and thorough analysis of the train of thought that I just summarized. Its crucial outcome is that being and nothing, or their equivalents, are forever intertwined. The unfolding of their "identity in difference" as becoming and its successors is what Hegel shows us in the remainder of the SL.

This becomes especially clear in the second and third of the SL's three major parts. Rosen's book moves into high gear in chapter 8 and following, in which he analyzes the SL's second major part, the Doctrine of Essence. For "essence" is, in effect, the intelligibility of being, which Hegel is aiming to exhibit. Rosen argues that Aristotle's account of "essence" was circular: "In order to define an essence we would have to state its essential properties. But we could not know the essential properties unless we had grasped the essence" (220). The development of thought on this subject, which Rosen traces from John Locke through Kant to J. G. Fichte, simply intensified the problem. The evident absence of an accessible essence amounted to an absence of intelligibility, and this is nihilism.

Rosen describes Hegel as embracing the Locke-Kant-Fichte annihilation of essence, but doing so in order to go beyond it. Hegel "is going to show how the categorial structure that we must invoke in order to substantiate the rationality of our assertion of nihilism is itself the ground through which being is rescued from the dominance of nothing and restored to equal footing" (274). Rosen shows with remarkable clarity and precision how Hegel does this through the "reflection-determinations" of identity, difference, diversity, and contradiction, and through ground, appearance, and actuality. Rosen's chapters 11 through 16 on these topics constitute the only fully comprehensive and philosophically penetrating account of the SL's Doctrine of Essence that I am aware of. They are a brilliant synthesis.

The SL's third major part, the Doctrine of the Concept, describes the emergence, from the reconstituted "essence" called "actuality," of full-blown subjectivity or thought. So here the intelligibility that was destroyed by the initial annihilation of essence, returns in full force. This is where Hegel links up with Kant's focus on the transcendental subject. But he does so with a difference, because what he calls the "Concept" subsumes the pure "being" with which the Logic began, and thus does not set up the subject in opposition to something external to it, the object or thing-in-itself. Indeed, the Concept's own development or unfolding reveals both a subjective side, which is the thought processes of judgment and syllogism, and an objective side, which is mechanism, life, and teleology. Because the Concept subsumes being as well as essence, we know that the subjective and objective sides will in the end be united. This unity Hegel calls the "Idea," with the analysis of which he concludes the Logic. Rosen provides an elegant and insightful account of all of this, and especially of Hegel's treatment of judgment and syllogism, where he makes it clear how what Hegel has to say is not undermined by the development of functional logic byFrege, Russell, and their successors.

Now I am very much in sympathy with Rosen's broad program in this book, and with the specific parts of it that I've mentioned. But I have two substantial reservations about his success in carrying out his program. They both have to do with his treatment of the first of the Logic's three major parts, the "Doctrine of Being," and with consequences that that treatment has for his presentation of the Logic as a whole.

The first reservation has to do with Rosen's treatment of the philosophical "theology" that he acknowledges is a salient feature of the Logic. The importance and the strangeness of that theology are both evident from the final sentences of Rosen's book, in which he says that at the end of the SL, "we have thought the logical or categorical structure of the world. It now remains for us who are at one with God to create the world." In a footnote, Rosen writes that

It is characteristic of extreme left Hegelianism to interpret Hegel as a lightly concealed atheist who was accommodating his true views to the doctrines of his largely Lutheran audience. I find no evidence for this reading in the SL. But one could certainly call Hegel an unorthodox Christian for whom God is the absolute, and therefore theAufhebung [lifting up and surpassing] of the separation of God from his creation (and so of God from humankind) . . . . (490 n. 2 to chapter 4)

Is the Hegel whom Rosen describes still talking about what religious believers call "God"? Rosen tells us that Hegel is not a "pantheist," inasmuch as Hegel's God is "different from his creation . . . as an original is different from its image . . . . God and the world exhibit an identity within difference" (66). How believers might or should respond to this is a question that Rosen doesn't address. I'll return to it.

My second reservation about Rosen's account of the SL has to do with his repeated statement, in connection with the issue of subject/object unity, that (as he puts it on p. 244) "We cannot separate being from thinking except through an analysis of the thinking of being. Since this analysis takes place within thought itself, the separation can never be accomplished." Rosen appears to regard this argument as sufficient to establish the unity-in-difference of thought and being, subject and object. But surely we can think of a being as one that will never be thought of. It doesn't follow from our describing the being in this very abstract way that we think the being in the way that we think most beings. So Hegel's argument had better not be as short as Rosen suggests it is.

In fact, I believe that Hegel gives an argument in the Doctrine of Being that clarifies both why the "God" he describes deserves that name, and why thought and true being can't ultimately be separated. This is his argument from "determinate being" (Dasein) to true infinity. Hegel describes Dasein as taking the form of "something" or "an other," where each is defined as not being the other. Hegel then points out that we think something should really be what it is by virtue of itself, an sich, and not by virtue of its relations to others. He considers finitude as a way in which a being might be what it is by virtue of itself because it is (as it were) separated off, but he points out that the finite's "limit" or Schranke is itself a relation to the "other," so a finite being can't be fully "separate."

The next candidate for enabling the something to be what it is by virtue of itself is the infinite, which Hegel associates with freedom or self-determination. Here Hegel makes the much-cited point that an "infinite" that is simply "beyond" the finite, is limited by this relationship to the finite and thus fails to be infinite. So rather than being "beyond" the finite, the true infinite (Hegel says) is the finite's sublating of itself.[1] Here, "sublating" means "lifting up" to a higher or more adequate status; and the lifting up that Hegel has in mind is that of self-determining freedom, in which a finite being (as we call it) goes beyond its mere finitude.

Now this is the reason why Hegel is fully justified in calling the Absolute Idea and Absolute Spirit, which are truly infinite in this way, "God." They are "God" because they don't fail to be infinite, as "God" as commonly conceived does, by being separate from and thus limited and rendered finite by the world that this God creates. By virtue of being truly infinite, the Absolute Idea and Absolute Spirit are likewise truly transcendent; whereas "God" as commonly conceived (the "separate" God), which is in fact simply finite, thereby fails to transcend the finite things of the world. This is Hegel's critique of the common conception of God, and it's his justification for introducing the different conception, often referred to by scholars as "not orthodox," that he lays out in the SL and the Encyclopedia.

Every "orthodox" theist wants their God to be infinite. But not all theists have understood that a God who is separate from the world is thereby finite and fails to be infinite. Quite a few Christian and other theologians do seem to have understood this point; for example, Plotinus, Pseudo-Dionysius, St. Thomas Aquinas, Paul Tillich, Karl Rahner.[2] But many scholars who write about Hegel don't appear to understand how Hegel's analytical account of this point makes him an important interlocutor in discussion within Christian and other monotheistic traditions, rather than a "not orthodox" outlier.

Finally, the argument that I just outlined also speaks to the issue of subject and object, thought and being. It speaks to this issue because thought is what enables a finite being (as we call it) to "sublate itself" in freedom and thus to be what it is by virtue of itself and to be "real" in the fullest sense. The conclusion of Hegel's argument from Dasein to true infinity is that "it is not the finite which is the real, but the infinite" (because the finite fails to be what it is by virtue of itself).[3] So what's truly real, according to Hegel, is what engages in thought, and thus is free, self-sublating, and infinite. So reality is not, in principle, separable from thought. This seems to be Hegel's central, explicit argument for the unity-in-difference of being and thought, or object and subject.

Professor Rosen has a different reading of the passages that I'm drawing on here. It's noteworthy that he makes no further reference to these passages in his discussions of later parts of the SL. Whereas my reading, by showing how these passages illuminate the two key issues that I've discussed, gives the passages a central role both in the SL and (indirectly) in the Encyclopedia.[4] Of course, a detailed evaluation of our differing readings would require much more space than I have here.[5]

[1] "The finite is not sublated by the infinite as by a power existing outside it; on the contrary, its infinity consists in sublating its own self." Hegel's Science of Logic, trans. A.V. Miller (Humanities Press, 1989), p. 146; Hegel, Wissenschaft der Logik. Die Lehre vom Sein (1832), ed. H.-J. Gawoll (Meiner Verlag, 1990), pp. 145-6; Gesammelte Werke vol. 21 (Meiner, 1985), p. 135. (Unfortunately, the page references in Rosen's text are only to the Meiner paperbacks, including the Gawoll volume, and not to the Gesammelte Werke, which should be the standard reference now for scholarly purposes.)

[2] The point is not universally recognized, even in academic writing. To take a random example, we are told that "The God in question here . . . has traditionally been identified as a being who is all-powerful, all-knowing," etc. (Timothy A. Robinson, ed., God (Hackett, 2002), p. xv; emphasis added). "A being," Hegel would point out, is bounded by whatever other beings there are, and thus is finite.

[3] SL, Miller trans., p. 149; Gawoll ed., p. 150; GW vol. 21, p. 136.

[4] I examine these passages in detail in chapter 3 of my Hegel's Philosophy of Reality, Freedom, and God (Cambridge University Press, 2005). I provide a summary of my interpretation of Hegel's philosophical theology in "Hegel's God: How We Know It, and Why It Deserves to be Called 'God'" (posted April 3, 2014).

[5] Thanks to Stephen Theron for discussion of these issues.