The Idea of Humanity: Anthropology and Anthroponomy in Kant's Ethics

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Sussman, David G., The Idea of Humanity: Anthropology and Anthroponomy in Kant's Ethics, Routledge, 2001, 357pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0815339844.

Reviewed by G. Felicitas Munzel, University of Notre Dame


Appearing in the Harvard series, Studies in Ethics, Outstanding Dissertations, Sussman’s examination contributes to the current development in Kant scholarship which treats the historical texts, anthropological writings, and philosophy of religion not as peripheral, but as the context in and through which to gain insight into the critical philosophy. The focal question of Sussman’s inquiry is that of the unconditional authority of morality, the priority of moral over non-moral concerns, or more methodologically, how one makes the transition from the “descriptive law of a purely intelligible being to a prescriptive law for a being that is not, and can never be, a pure intelligence” (7). The inquiry takes seriously the intertwined, long-standing criticisms of Kant’s ethics which, broadly speaking, concern its internal coherence, indeed the coherence of his conceptions of freedom and will. Building on Korsgaard’s idea of “reflective endorsement” (73), Sussman’s response to Kant’s critics and reconstruction of the critical argument turn on the notion of the conceptual precedence of morality for all aspects of human self-understanding, claiming that not only is morality endorsed from the standpoint of all possible external, competing perspectives, but that there could be no perspective available to us from which morality could intelligibly be called into question (16, 73-74, 102, 242-245). The analysis finds the account of agency, rationality, and human willing in Kant’s philosophy of religion significantly expanded and revised over the earlier discussions in the Groundwork and the Critique of Practical Reason (a point developed in chapters four through seven). Central to this revision are the concepts of the highest good and rational faith (themselves expanded beyond their earlier versions), as well as the notion of radical evil. By appealing to the conceptual sphere of law, Sussman delineates the ideas of justification and of authority and distinguishes the question of authority from the question of competing motivational forces (101-102). Under this reading, moral failings are identified as failures of rationality (239) and, in the process, an elegant counter is given to naturalism and to psychologistic readings of Kant’s ethics.

The first chapter serves to introduce the questions and claims of the project. The work of chapter two is to retrace the arguments for the justification of morality in the Groundwork and the second Critique respectively, showing that in both cases, whatever else might be explicated about the circularity of the accounts (practical deliberation presupposes freedom, 27-30; moral law is conceptually prior to freedom and first provides a positive definition of freedom, 50-54, 61), the question about the authority of morality over non-moral interests remains open (32, 67).

In Chapter Three, the author seeks to show “that Kant has an account of the moral law’s status as a Fact of Reason which is neither viciously circular nor dogmatic,” nor consists in the kind of “deduction which Kant explicitly denies us” (71). The approach centers on the judging subject, on its temporal, pedagogical order of development, as distinct from the objective, logical order of concepts (although the author himself does not explicitly speak of education or Bildung). As Sussman points out, however, as individuals and species, human beings begin “with no ideas, reason, or self-conceptions in place;” they begin as “wholly heteronomous creature[s] possessed of incomplete instinct and affect” and, in order to come “to practical reason at all,” they require “transformative work” effected by “practices that work on the body and the affects” (101). In this light, the naturalistic route, which takes susceptibility to pleasure and pain as the most basic notion and has only explanatory (and not normative) significance, would lead to an impoverished self-understanding in which pleasure is seen as no more than a motivational power of desire, driving the subject toward a particular act or omission (84). In short, in order to distinguish between a rational order of justification and a natural order of causal explanation, in order to see that what one is moved to do and what one has good reason to do can be very different things, the judging and acting subject requires a conceptual structure framed by ideas of law and obligation (97, 82).

On this interpretation of Kant’s argument, “only with the recognition of the moral law do we gain access to the sphere of concepts by which we can understand our own behavior in a non-naturalistic way, to see ourselves as acting for some good rather than just responding to some drive. The idea of law is being called on to radically transfigure the possibilities of what self-love and happiness can be for us” (86). The answer to the question why self-consciousness must see itself bound by law, rather than aspiring to the good, repeats what is required to educate human beings, to bring them to the practical perspective: it is the “juridical ideas of culpability and desert” which “first bring the distinction between justification and motivation to light… . To be capable of any kind of practical reasoning, one needs to understand the difference between merely being moved or disposed to do something, and having a reason to so act” (91, 92-93). In sum, the “Fact of Reason expresses reason’s transcendental ’act’ of self-construction or transformation” (reading Faktum here in its sense of deed or action), “by which its regulative ideals are given a constitutive employment, producing a new logical order of judgment which takes reasons themselves as its objects, and setting up the very justificatory standards by which this constitution could itself be judged” (111). The author further concludes that a “minimally decent upbringing” is required, not in order for “morality’s claims to have authority over the agent,” but in order for the agent to be able to grasp the “relevant interdefined concepts” and to “to be able to comprehend such authority” (108). An important text for supporting and developing this point would be the doctrine of method in Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason (which the author does not explicitly reference here). Nonetheless, with this chapter, the main parameters for the conceptual precedence of morality for all aspects of human self-understanding are laid down.

The second half of the discussion, chapters four through seven, examines how the Kantian aspects of human self-understanding—self-love, happiness, goodness, the highest good, vice, evil, and rational faith—are themselves understood within the framework of the conceptual priority of morality. Sussman turns primarily to the Religion to see how these notions change from Kant’s account in the Groundwork and second Critique. The focus in chapter four is on the conception and role of rational faith in Kant’s moral theory, specifically the question of in what sense faith can function as a moral supplement without being subject to the critics’ charge that such a move precisely invites “the morally perilous attitude of seeking and supplementing morally decisive reasons with non-moral ones” (147). The answer, that faith serves as a “parergon to morality,” that it is an attitude of trust, addresses the problem of those inclinations which are themselves already moralized (indignation and outrage) and so could turn the strength of morality against itself (156, 149-150). Insofar as our sensibility is informed and sensitive to moral concerns, the highest good is more than a direct entailment of the moral law; it is an end we set ourselves, fulfilling the need of human reason to have an end and not just a principle upon which to act (146). Faith makes the highest good an object of love, one moreover which is set apart from other objects of moral love by its implicit promise of moral justice: the virtuous are happy because they deserve to be so and the wicked suffer appropriately (147-149). In the actual world of human affairs, however, the relation between what people get and what they deserve is haphazard and, while such perversity is no argument against the moral law’s legitimacy, Kant’s worry (on the author’s reading) is that, in the kind of rational being which we humans are, emotional sensibility will lag behind the critical rational understanding of the moral law; this gap is readily filled by cynicism, which sees the arbitrariness of fate as a challenge to morality (150-153). Faith as trust (and not doctrinal belief, which would once again play into the cynic’s hands by inviting arguments for unanswerable questions) affords a different way of looking at the same picture; the moral arbitrariness of nature is seen as only a local phenomenon (and not as characteristic of eternal existence) and thus we “cease to be receptive to the kind of outrage that clouds a clear understanding of the nature of morality and its authority over us” (179, 155).

Chapter five responds to the critics’ charge that Kant’s account of freedom is incoherent because it cannot explain the possibility of evil. The author’s analysis turns on rejecting the view of the will as a kind of psychological cause operating in accord with the logic of mechanism and on identifying instead the logical problems in the exercise of rational agency, especially the confusion of the normative status of moral reasons and the logical demand of intelligibility (208, 202), or the illusion of treating reasons as lesser and greater motivational forces whose “vector sum causally determines our actions” (205). So, the passions fragment the will not because it is the locus of competing causal forces, but because in the person who succumbs to passion, while the individual actions may be intelligible (insofar as one can comprehend what the agent took to be worthwhile in doing it), the individual reasons conflict with one another (for example, reasons of duty, ambition, envy) and are globally incoherent; the agent fails to realize a consistent conception of the good, a whole outlook to give unity to the will (203). This conceptual analysis of the human will yields the following interpretation of Kant’s three grades of moral transgression. Frailty is not a psychological limitation, but a logical or metaphysical property of a finite will, a necessary feature of what it is to be capable of action on the basis of reasons; our vulnerability to passion in general remains unaffected by curtailing vulnerability to any particular passions (211-212). In the case of impurity, we misunderstand the normative status of moral reasons in general and thus treat moral reasons as if they were just one kind of reason among others, keeping the questions open when moral considerations should have closed them (214-215). Wickedness is effectively an inverted image of the proper moral disposition, an anti-will (a point receiving further consideration in the remaining chapters) (216).

The conceptual analysis extends in chapter six to locating the possibility of evil in the difference again between the pedagogical and logical orders: “Morality is first in the logical order of concepts,” but “last in the order of our conceptual development. This divergence between the natural teleology of our empirical character and the conceptual teleology of our intelligible character provides the opening for vice and wickedness to insinuate itself into our wills” (265). Drawing on the Wittgensteinian notion of a family of concepts, Sussman interprets the three predispositions to goodness (in the Religion)—animality, humanity, personality—again not as psychological traits, but as “three logical axes that define the ’conceptual space’ that a human being occupies” (240). The three levels are conceptually connected; for example, animality is not simply what we share with other animals, but when transfigured by the concepts available to us through the ideas characteristic of humanity and personality, we grasp for the first time what animality in general is about (242). The human person is a “kind that is fundamentally defined with reference to personality, to those capacities and conditions characteristic of a fullblown moral self-understanding,” a claim that (if conceded) is sufficient to defend the unconditional authority of morality (243); personality has conceptual priority over humanity, and humanity over animality, while the ideas of child, or of mental illness, are derivative from the ideas defining personhood (243, 242). The author’s reading of the internal logic of Kant’s account also allows for a very clear statement as to why vice is not simply a departure from the mean, a mere excess or deficiency. The vices of both nature and culture are seen as “derived from a sort of conceptual contamination with the next higher predisposition” (248). For example, in order to conceive of pleasure as an end in its own right (as in the case of gluttony, in which we sacrifice our animal health), we need to have in play something like the idea of an end, of an object of action that we can reflectively frame for ourselves (248, 245). Ultimately, the vices all involve an “incoherent inversion of some set of moral-psychological concepts that is essential to human self-understanding. To this extent these vices are all miniature versions of the wicked disposition, where such a conceptual inversion overtakes our entire way of understanding ourselves” (255).

Chapter Seven begins with another familiar criticism of Kant’s moral account: if we start from wickedness, how are we able to do anything that could count as an attempt to become morally better (280)? In the terms of his sustained conceptual analysis, Sussman in fact articulates the problem at a yet deeper level. With the starting point for a life of real moral improvement being a unified rational self, a true association in which the idea of the parts is derivative of the idea of the whole (meaning that we have transformed ourselves from an aggregation of competing passions into a unified perspective on what there is reason to do and have translated relations of motivational forces into ones of rational authority), nothing done absent the moment of successful conversion can even qualify as an attempt in moral improvement (289-291, 300). However, as the author explains (by the analogy of grasping our birth as the beginning of our lives, once we actually occupy the life that only such a beginning makes possible), for Kant, “we never occupy the fortunate position of the successful convert, retrospectively telling the history of his present fortunate condition” (302). The solution is an active trust that there is such a perspective (a timeless understanding from whole to parts) on one’s life, a perspective that we cannot now occupy. Grace (namely to have our present state understood in terms of the totality of our character) is thus needed not to complete our moral labors, but to make it even logically possible to attempt to begin to do what we must. With trust in grace we can “coherently attempt to become a morally good person, with the thought that the correct description of my efforts derives from something I can now neither see nor know” (303). To become truly receptive to this grace on Kant’s view, concludes Sussman, requires a certain kind of moral community, the “Ethical Commonwealth,” the “republic under laws of virtue” of the Religion (280, 313-320).

To restate the point already made, the author’s analysis of the internal logic of Kant’s account brings into clear relief the problems with the causal and psychologistic readings of Kant’s moral philosophy, as well as illuminating the contrast with philosophical naturalism. The interpretation of conceptual priority, and with that of the priority of the whole, of totality, makes a profound statement about how and why the logical is not merely logical. Perhaps this is the most significant contribution, then, of Sussman’s reading of Kant: by its lucid articulation of the depth and substance of the formal aspects, it presents an elegant rebuttal to the ever resurfacing worry about the abstractness of Kant’s moral thought. Many of the elements treated in the process have received scholarly attention which is not acknowledged in the relatively short bibliography of secondary sources (just to mention two as examples, Jacqueline Marina’s work on grace and Richard Velkley’s work on the problem of the justification of reason). Nonetheless, Sussman’s interpretation invites both Kant’s critics and his followers to a new appreciation of the notion of the choice of goodness as a choice of intelligibility over incoherence.