The Image in Mind: Theism, Naturalism, and the Imagination

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Charles Taliaferro and Jil Evans, The Image in Mind: Theism, Naturalism, and the Imagination, Continuum, 2010, 224ppl. $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847064820.

Reviewed by Robert T. Pennock, Michigan State University


Written jointly by philosopher of religion Charles Taliaferro and visual artist Jil Evans, The Image in Mind takes up a suggestion of Suzanne Langer that religious thought operates primarily with images and that images alone can make us aware of the wholeness and form of entities and reality. Furthermore, and this is the claim upon which the authors want to extend Langer's proposal, only images can serve as a measure of the adequacy of the terms that describe reality. Taliaferro and Evans aim to apply this idea as a test of theistic versus naturalistic metaphysical worldviews.

In line with this approach, they speak of "the theistic image of the world" in contrast to "the naturalistic image." They begin with a general Platonic theism, centering on the idea of a teleological cosmos informed by values of truth, beauty and goodness, created and sustained by an all-good, purposive immaterial being. However, Taliaferro and Evans more often than not discuss specifically Christian forms of theism, and in the end defend a particular form that includes a Cristus Victor image of redemption and the promise of an eternal afterlife. Naturalism rejects this in favor of a strictly materialistic image of the world, though broad naturalism allows for the emergence of properties like consciousness, values and aesthetics.

Their definition of "image" refers primarily to "visual or pictorial images" and their account of the imagination refers to the power to create mental images, though they occasionally allow an extended use to mean "understanding" as in "my image of reality" (p. 3). They remain neutral with regard to specifics of the debate about sensory images beyond a basic commitment to there being mental images and that these are used by the imagination to think about the world. They set aside issues about representational mechanisms or non-imagistic accounts of cognition. Rich images, they argue, enable us to recognize values and evidence and to distinguish the genuinely possible from the merely chimerical.

The book begins with a historical review of philosophical views about imagination, including the powerful challenges from Wittgenstein and Ryle to the role of images in imagination, and a defense of what Taliaferro and Evans see as the active, positive use of images for perception and for evidential reasoning. The second chapter highlights ways they think that aesthetic factors play a role in scientific inquiry, such as in Darwin's biological investigations, and then gives an aesthetic account of what it is like to be a naturalist vs. a theist. The former may be pictured as cutting-edge, reliable, not prey to superstition, bold and beautiful, but it is also austere, tragic, and alienated. The latter focuses on the idea of an intrinsically good God as described above and various images of a purposefully created nature. Taliaferro and Evans recognize the variations among these positions (e.g., an extreme scientism to broader forms of naturalism, and the many stripes of theism), but their discussion of the purported aesthetic attributes of naturalism and theism is not equally fine-grained and thus is somewhat caricatured. To give just one counterexample, biologist E. O. Wilson is a naturalist and an atheist, but the evolutionary image of the world he describes is far from an alienated one, but rather is holistic and loving.

The next two chapters focus on problems of emergence, which they see as the major challenge for naturalism. The problem of evil is taken up in the penultimate chapter as the key challenge for theism. The final chapter gives their overall aesthetic and evidential assessment of how naturalism and theism fare in light of an inquiry that takes imagination and images seriously.

The chapters are mostly organized as an extended series of lengthy quotations interwoven with the authors' commentary. For a large proportion of the pages, the quoted material is longer than the commentary. It is not an exaggeration to say that nearly a quarter of the text consists of quotations. Were it intended for classroom use, this extreme approach would have the virtue of providing students significant exposure to a large amount of primary source material, but the $130 cost precludes this use.

A notable feature of the book is the sustained attention that it pays to biological evolution. Darwin receives substantive consideration in every chapter. Taliaferro and Evans articulate a theistic view that is not just accepting of evolution, but which incorporates it in an integrated and positive manner. They accept evolution as a biological fact, though they do take the emergence of consciousness to be a radical break in evolutionary history and argue that the best account of the evolution of consciousness somehow involves God's creativity. However, they reject the idea that this necessarily required multiple acts of special creation or miraculous intervention, holding that it could simply have been part of God's will that conscious subjects -- persons or minds -- come into being once physical organisms have evolved certain structures and constitution. They call this view theistic evolution, but I recommend keeping the standard, broader usage of that term as referring to any form of theism that is compatible with the findings of evolutionary science, rather than narrowing it to this particular view. The relationship between physical evolution and the evolution of consciousness is an especially salient question for theists, but it is not the only one (the origin of life, complexity, and the moral sense are others), and it is best to not unnecessarily restrict the scope of what is covered under theistic evolution.

Taliaferro and Evans propose to use the term naturalistic evolution to refer to strictly or broadly naturalistic accounts of the emergence of consciousness and conscious subjects, and to use the term evolution by itself in a way that is neutral with respect to theism and naturalism. Here, too, I'd recommend not restricting the terms to the issue of consciousness. However, I do support their view that evolution be understood in a way that is metaphysically neutral. Indeed, I would say that this is already the standard usage among philosophers and philosophically knowledgeable scientists. It has been creationists, such as Intelligent Design creationist Philip Johnson, who have tried to build atheism into the very definition of evolution to force theists to oppose evolution. But even atheists like Dawkins, who use evolution to argue against theism, do not presume that the term includes that metaphysical view by definition.

Taliaferro and Evans do take issue with Dawkins, Dennett, and other atheists in their book, but in general they are in a far stronger position to defend theism than creationists like Johnson because they accept evolution and do not saddle theism with an untenable rejection of well-established science. God need not be thought to create only ex nihilo; creation through gradual natural processes is equally acceptable. Evolution is simply one such process. Evolution, on their view, fits with the notion of an integrated and ultimately good world.

They dismiss a variety of religious concerns about evolution that get in the way of a compatibilist view for some theists. For instance, some oppose evolution because they think the idea of being descended from animals diminishes human dignity. Rejecting that conclusion, they take the evolutionary implication to be not that human dignity is reduced, but rather that the dignity of non-human animals is elevated over what Christians might have previously thought. They are mind-first dualists, but their form of dualism is "integrative" -- recognizing the "functional unity of the person-body relationship" (p. 98) that neither debases the body nor holds that embodied minds are exempt from physical-chemical laws.

This fits in well with other aspects of their integrated view, including their response to animal suffering. They discuss Darwin's thoughts about this aspect of the problem of evil and do not try to avoid the problem, as classical dualists often do, by claiming that animals do not suffer because they do not have souls. They accept that animals have minds and defend the view that many non-human animals are conscious and that at least some of them are selves. Their solution is that suffering is an inevitable side-effect of a good natural world characterized by co-dependency and integration.

Taliaferro and Evans discuss Darwin's views on ethics and aesthetics and are generally supportive of his moral theoretical framework, which they say works from either a naturalistic and a theistic perspective. They slightly take issue with his account of the sense of beauty (for a weak reason, I must say; they exaggerate his difficulty explaining the peacock's tail and make no mention of sexual selection), but contend there are grounds for a Darwinian ideal aesthetic observer theory, appealing to their notion of "fittingness." I wish they had said more about this idea, but it remains undeveloped, as do too many other ideas.

This collaboration between philosopher and painter promised a unique perspective on the significance of visual images in the debate between theism and naturalism, but the promise is largely unfulfilled. In only a few places do we hear a clearly artistic voice, such as in the description of their broad sense of aesthetics for which the collapse of a bridge may at first be an image of horror, but in which one may afterwards nevertheless find beauty, when "the physical re-ordering of materials creates new three-dimensional compositions, whose scale and intricacies invite inspection of massive disorder and incredulous juxtapositions" (p. 39). The way that beauty may emerge even out of disorder is relevant in several ways to the book and would have been worth elaboration. I would also have liked to see discussion of the Galapagos Cactus Wars series of paintings by Evans that separate the chapters, which were painted as part of a three-year investigation of the role of the imagination in light of evolutionary biology. (The black and white images don't do justice to the paintings and I recommend checking out the artist's web page to see these in color.)

So what about the central thesis that images and imagination can serve as a test of theism vs. naturalism? Unfortunately, this is the weakest element of The Image in Mind. Early on, Taliaferro and Evans introduce the image of a book as a traditional picture of the world for theism in contrast to naturalism's image of a machine. But little is made of either of these images. Nor is there much discussion of alternative theistic images, such as Paley's watch and watchmaker, God as father, judge or burning bush, and so on.

They do discuss Dennett's image of theism as an unsupported skyhook, admitting that it fits with a traditional theistic image of God pictured as floating overhead in the clouds. Dennett's satirical image gets its rhetorical power in part from its faithfulness to this traditional image. Taliaferro and Evans respond in defense of a mind-first, theistic approach by trying to co-opt Dennett's contrasting image of the crane (which still hoists, but with a base grounded in physical reality rather than a magically free-floating hook) and "re-picturing" theism as itself a crane, but one that provides a deeper account of the physical cranes that Dennett speaks of. But how does the image of the crane (a machine) fit with the authors' original claim that the image of theism is a book? Moreover, their extended reply to Dennett involves standard philosophical arguments and the image plays no substantive role.

I would have liked to see Taliaferro and Evans take their thesis seriously and provide some analysis of traditional, common images of God, for example. Do a Google image search for "God" and the vast majority of the top hits are indeed of deities (mostly bearded men, but a few who are blue or have a trunk) floating in the clouds. The page for "Theism" starts with the close-up of God's and Adam's hands from the ceiling of the Sistine Chapel, but overall is word-heavy, bringing up few visual images. Most surprisingly absent is any significant discussion of the concept of the imago dei. For a book that aims to argue for theism on the basis of the power of image, this is a glaring omission. Genesis 1:26-28 introduces the idea that God created humankind "in our image." The straightforward interpretation of this would seem to involve a likeness of visual forms, but this quickly becomes absurd. Is God really to be understood as a biped? And with both male and female body parts? To try to avoid such absurdities, one could focus, as the authors mostly do, on the abstract theistic conception of God as omnipotent spirit, but this further highlights why their thesis about images as a test of theism is implausible. How are these abstractions to be understood and evaluated pictorially?

One cartoon in the Google image list for theism depicts God standing before a map board with a helpful arrow labeled "You are here" and many more all saying "And here." Amusing, but hardly something that provides visual evidence in favor of theism. And if you think that representing God's omnipresence in an image is difficult, try to imagine how to depict omniscience (Google image offers not much besides a few giant eyes floating in the clouds) or omnibenevolence (Alvin Plantinga's smiling visage appears on the first page of images for this, but little else even applies). One could go on for most any of the disputed concepts Taliaferro and Evans discuss. What image depicts free will, an uncaused first cause, or even consciousness? (I leave these as an exercise for the reader. Just be prepared for a lot of glowing blue brains.) If images truly function as a test of theism and naturalism, our general inability to visually depict these concepts would seem to argue against their possibility. In one brief paragraph, the authors offer a single illustration, borrowed from Wayne Roosa, of the image of the Ark of the Covenant where "the sculptural imagery of cherubim wings defines an empty center that implies the nature of God, showing how this very material image evokes the existence of One who exists in a different order." (p. 56) But this provides no handle for assessing the possibility of such a being.

Nor is this difficulty limited to understanding what to make of the imago dei; it is a general problem with all the parts of their argument that try to say that some aspect of the world is more plausible given theism than naturalism. As I have argued elsewhere, there is no sensible way to determine that some feature of the world is more likely given theism (or any supernatural view). Images provide no basis for resolving this difficulty, and the notion in their example of existing "in a different order" highlights a source of the problem. It is inappropriate to make such assessments on our own, human, terms, for God is not comprehensible in natural terms. Indeed, trying to do so amounts to naturalizing the Divine, and that would hardly be a win for theism.