The Imagination in German Idealism and Romanticism

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Gerad Gentry and Konstantin Pollok (eds.), The Imagination in German Idealism and Romanticism, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 267pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107197701.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


This collection of essays is devoted to the interpretation of work on the imagination done by Kant, Fichte, Hegel, Herder, Schleiermacher, and Schlegel. It divides fairly naturally into two parts: i) close readings of Kant, Fichte, and Hegel on the 'mental mechanics' of imagination as a faculty that mediates between sensibility and understanding, and ii) essays on the role of imagination in the interpretation of art, human beings, and other cultures, as that role was conceived by Herder, Schleiermacher, Schlegel and Hegel. One essay on Kant on aesthetic rationality falls somewhat between these two categories. Broadly speaking, there is not much connection within the essays between (i) and (ii). It is also not true, as Gerad Gentry puts it in his editor's introduction, that analytic philosophy of

the past century has displayed widespread skepticism toward any serious significance of the imagination for something like . . . a philosophical program, . . . by and large passing over . . . terms such as productivity, creation, artistic representation and formation, freedom of reflection, spontaneity, and growth. (18-19)

Think of the work of Kendall Walton, Richard Wollheim, Nelson Goodman, Arthur Danto, Roger Scruton, Mark Johnson, and Ted Cohen, among many others. (Perhaps Gentry thinks that insofar as these figures are largely denizens of the realm of aesthetics, their work eo ipso falls outside mainstream analytic philosophy.) There is substantial variation in quality, originality, and interest across the individual essays. Some of the scholarship is first-rate, however, and scholars who are interested specifically in German idealist accounts of productive imagination and in the hermeneutics of art will find significant materials for thought here.

In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant famously calls the imagination "a blind though indispensable function of the soul, without which we would have no cognition at all, but of which we are seldom even conscious."[1] Looking closely at the A and B deductions, Clinton Tolley finds a four stage process of the construction of experience, in the sense of the entertaining of truth-evaluable judgmental content. This process i) begins with the construction of an intuition as a possibly unconscious simple apprehension of an appearance of an object (for example, a visual look) at a moment, ii) proceeds to the synthesis of apprehension in imagination that yields consciousness of the look in the form of a perceptual image at a moment, iii) holds that image in mind for some time longer than a moment in a synthesis of reproduction, and finally iv) takes that perceptual image to present truth-evalualable content (putatively) caused by an object. Perception -- stage (ii) -- thus mediates unconscious, intuitive attention and judgmental experience. It is a form of awareness that is necessarily present to consciousness but less than judgmentally structured. The perceptual image -- the product of stage (ii) -- represents the intuition, as Tolley puts it. A more traditional reading would have only three stages: the synthesis of an intuition that is present to consciousness at a moment, the holding in mind of this intuition, and recognition of the intuition as falling under a concept. It is not quite clear to me what the advantages (textual support aside) of the four stage model are, since what the remainder of the deduction turns on is how it is possible at all for there to be judgmentally structured, truth-evaluable contents of consciousness. Distinguishing an initial step of unconscious construction of an intuition from a second step of the construction of a conscious perceptual image seems not to bear on this argument, and there are perhaps good reasons to deny that all consciousness of intuitions takes the form of images (e.g., the consciousness of the number 11 or of a triangle -- is the image, as Berkeley objected, scalene, isosceles, or equilateral?). Perhaps Tolley thinks that the presence of the first two stages of his model brings the early stages of human judgmental experience closer to the kind of perceptual consciousness that other animals have or perhaps closer to the results of contemporary experimental cognitive psychology, though he does not explore these topics. But Tolley's textual analysis is careful and thorough, and one may hope that he will take up such further issues in future work.

Tobias Rosefeldt concentrates specifically on the process of the construction of the pure intuition of time, due to "synthetic activity which is a result of the understanding determining sensibility," not an effect of passive sensibility alone. (49) Further, "in order to represent time . . . we have to draw a straight line in the imagination." (51) We then establish a directionality for time by "attending to our own activity in drawing" as the later portions of the line we draw appear after the earlier portions. (51) We attend "to our own causal efficacy" in bringing it about that our extending of a line segment occurs after our initiating of it. (58) Here Rosefeldt is surely correct to hold that pure intuitional awareness of space and time is something to which we actively contribute. It is less obvious, however, that it requires drawing a line (physically or mentally) for the case of time awareness. Think of how we learn the meanings of the words "before" and "after" in contexts like "one more story before bedtime" or "you may have a cookie after you finish your peas." Such thoughts raise problems for the entire enterprise of Kantian transcendental psychology, as does work in cognitive-developmental experimental psychology about when and how time consciousness arises. Like Tolley, Rosefeldt stays largely within the orbit of Kant interpretation, and here too we can hope for future work that will bring Kantian psychology into engagement with larger issues.

Ever since Fichte, Schelling, Hegel, and, especially Heidegger, some readers of Kant have been tempted to see the productive imagination as a faculty that is "an antecedent and primordial feature" or a hidden root of the construction of experience. (67) Günter Zöller undertakes to defang this reading and to "demystify and demote" the role of productive imagination in the construction of experience, without denying it altogether. According to Zöller, sensibility and understanding "form a complexly fused unity," with the imagination "purposively going back and forth" between them. (71, 78) (Interestingly, Zöller denies, contra Rosefeldt, that the imagination plays any role in the construction of the pure intuitions of space and time, which he sees as passively given, not made. [77]) Imagination, according to Zöller, is less a source of content than it is the epigenetic functional activity of fitting together material from sensibility and forms provided by the understanding to yield a new product: judgment. (104-105) This reading fits well with austere readings of the transcendental deduction that concentrate on the Objective Deduction and seek to avoid troublesomely speculative psychology. But it also provides a less richly detailed description of the construction of experience than some readers such as Tolley and Rosefeldt will want.

Keren Gorodeisky elaborates Kant's account of our unified but also richly differentiated rational capacities of understanding, desire, and feeling pleasure in relation to their respective objects. These capacities are all rational, insofar as there are principles governing their respective exercises for achieving the status of a rational agent in actuality rather than merely potentially. Imagination is crucial in all three domains in allowing us to see things in a new light so as to pick up on a necessary unity: respectively, of properties as combined in an object ("that cup is red"), of an action as necessary (or prohibited) in order to express (or not to violate) respect ("do that"), or of a singular object as to-be-appreciated ("enjoy that freely"). Both the possession of rational capacities and their appropriate actual exercise under principles are "central to our being rational animals". (105) Facts call for beliefs, ends in themselves call for actions that express respect, and beauties call for feelings, as Gorodeisky puts it, and human beings qua rational agents are distinctively the kinds of beings who can and do (with appropriate training and under appropriate imaginative attentiveness) respond to these calls. (95) The imagination, in helping us to do these things, allows us, uniquely "to cognize, act in, and appreciate the empirical world in accord with the transcendental requirement of lawfulness". (105) While Gorodeisky here largely sticks to Kant interpretation -- there are brief, apt remarks about Danto on imagination -- this essay is also closely related to her important essay, together with Eric Marcus, "Aesthetic Rationality,"[2] where the Kantian picture of aesthetic rationality is systematically defended against opposing views (e.g., sentimentalism, subjectivism, aesthetic property objectivism). Her systematic, sharply focused, and powerfully articulated account of our nature as rational animals, as Kant understands it (with echoes of Aristotle on capacities, but with distinctly modern pictures of theoretical knowledge, morality, and beauty), is a major contribution to Kant studies and to the understanding of rational belief, rational action, and rational appreciation.

Johannes Haag takes up Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre project of providing a better ground for experience, or explanation of judgmental consciousness, founded on a more certain first principle than Kant's thesis of the unity of apperception and yielding a better deduction of objectivity than Kant provides. Haag sees Fichte's theory of imagination as crucial to this effort. "Only the power of imagination, oscillating between opposites and thus mitigating and mediating between then, can give reality to the opposites [finite subject and finite object] themselves." (118) The imagination produces "all the elements that are necessary for determined intuitive reference to objects and to ourselves as representing subjects." (121) These claims naturally raise the questions i) what determines, or houses and sets in motion, the activity of the imagination?, and ii) does this story yield a sufficient deduction of 'full-blooded' externality? Fichte's answer to the first question is that "pure or absolute activity" (some of which is "turned into passivity") is the real ground of the activity of the imagination. (124) Following Fichte, Haag seems to take this answer to be satisfactory, or at least philosophically interesting, in implying "a robust conception of an object of representation" and even, after a further deduction of space and time, a deduction of the existence of the thing in itself. (127, 128) Part of the answer to the question of how there can be real externality here is that Fichte's account of absolute activity is itself supposed to be part of a "pragmatic history of the mind . . . first coming into being itself." (120) Haag's reconstruction of Fichte's views is accurate and insightful. But note the treatment of mind as 'inner' substance that is implied by "coming into being itself" and by Fichte's story generally. Once an inner/outer interaction problem is taken to stand at the center of the problem of discursive consciousness, then one may well wonder whether enough 'externality' will ultimately come into view and whether the 'mental mechanics' necessary to 'ground' it will be other than conjectural and emptily formal -- problems that have always haunted Fichteanism.

Meghant Sudan traces affinities between the accounts of imagination given by Kant and Hegel. For each of them, "self-affection" (Kant) and "a self-relating, cognitive process" (Hegel) are crucial for discursive consciousness -- as in Fichte. (138, 143) In both Kant and Hegel, "we see shared modeling of mind as integrating reception and reflection." (146) These affinities are real, and Sudan's attention to Hegel's theory of Subjective Mind (his individual developmental psychology) is welcome. Overall, however, the interpretation consists largely of commonplaces about both Kant and Hegel while, as in other essays in this volume, relying on an inner/outer distinction and sidestepping crucial issues about embodiment and training, albeit while officially acknowledging them. We would need much more detail than is provided and quite possibly a very different vocabulary in order really to make sense of how "determinations of mind . . . are moments of [the] self-manifestation [of] a self-relating, cognitive process." (143)

Gentry takes the work of the imagination to lie at the heart of Hegel's treatment of the logic of life as it appears in The Science of Logic. Contra recent readings of Hegel on life by Robert Pippin and James Kreines, Gentry argues that for Hegel the development of human life is not determined by any quasi-Aristotelian Naturzweck or soul as a principle of organization and development. Instead, the inner purposiveness that unfolds in human life closely resembles the operations of the free lawfulness of the imagination as Kant describes them in The Critique of Judgment. The kinds of necessity that inform judgment and thought, as well as the free human life that express them, are the result of "a structure of self-determination," a matter of "the abstract necessity of thought" itself, not of any external biological organization. (169, 162) It is surely right that biological organization alone does not fully determine the development of human life. But the difference between Gentry's reading and those of Pippin and Kreines is perhaps somewhat less than meets the eye, since for Hegel thinking is both bound up in concrete world engagements on the part of a living organism and freely self-determining and determinative of cultural life in being a matter of distinctively rational soul or form.

Developing a line of thinking in important earlier work,[3] Michael N. Forster argues that Herder's account of the role of "imaginative sympathy" or "imaginative, non-committal recapturing" in interpreting other persons, other cultures, and other historical periods is more faithful to what we actually do in interpretation than the anti-psychologisms of Frege and Wittgenstein. (185, 189, 183) Insofar as patiently reconstructing the "perceptual and affective sensations" as well as the semantic, epistemic, and practical commitments of subjects is in view, rather than the literal having or sharing of them, Herder's position further avoids Gadamer's charge that it succumbs to skepticism about other minds. (189) Through "an arduous process of historical-philological inquiry," but only through such a process, interpreters can sometimes bridge real gaps that divide human subjects, cultures, and historical periods. (177) Forster is correct about the virtues of Herder's view, but he perhaps underemphasizes the importance of capturing distinctively semantic contents. It is at least arguable that the later Wittgenstein is not anti-psychologistic, but instead "undo[es] the psychologizing of psychology," as Stanley Cavell once put it, in setting human meaning-making within larger contexts of action, practice, and feeling that are both historically changing and distinctive of the human form of life.[4]

Noting affinities between Schleiermacher and Herder, and developing her earlier reading of Schleiermacher,[5] Kristin Gjesdal similarly defends Schleiermacher's I-Thou hermeneutics both against Gadamerian misunderstandings and in its own terms. We must "acknowledge the inherent opacity of the expressions of others," but also do so without despair. (195) Through hard reflective-critical work, involving both understanding of shared grammars across languages and freer, sympathetic-imaginative divination or what Schleiermacher calls Fingerspitzgefühl, we can at least approach seeing "as it were, the world from [the] point of view" of another. (199, 206) Here the idea that we need both grammar and semantics, on the one hand, and more finely focused imagination, sympathy, and tact in order to interpret others well is especially welcome.

Elizabeth Millán Brusslan contrasts Fichte's theoretical account of how the imagination works as a formative power with Friedrich Schlegel and other Romantics who "perform a sort of poetry in their writings." (208) For Fichte, productive imagination is primarily effective in concept formation, and Fichte has little to say about either beauty or art. In contrast, Schlegel defends and practices aesthetic liberalism, but without developing any philosophical system of experience. (223) Millán Brusslan seems more sympathetic with the pursuit of Schlegelian Romantic freedom as unendliche Dichtung in all spheres of life than with Fichte.

Allen Speight compares and contrasts "the reimagination of art, religion, and philosophy" as carried out by Hegel and Schlegel. (230) Contra his own later criticisms of Romantic degeneracy, Hegel in the "Religion" chapter of the Phenomenology attends to both pre-Greek Egyptian, Indian, and Persian religious phenomena and to developing "active forces of contemporary spirit" in ways that resemble Schlegel's 1800 "Lecture on Mythology." (229) Both the Hegel of the "Religion" chapter and the Schlegel of the "Lecture" see the symbolic form of art as bound up with religious content that is not presentable otherwise, both take seriously the presence of both the beautiful and the sublime in the history of art, and both offer accounts of how and why art matters. For both, artists are figures in and through whom new views about the significance and direction of life emerge. (236) We would do well, Speight suggests, in both the philosophy of art and the philosophy of general culture, to take up their thoughts about "the centrally human question of meaning and interpretation that art raises" instead of, say, worrying so much about such things as the objectivity of taste or the nature of aesthetic properties.

Overall, the idea that the imagination is central both in the formation of human discursive consciousness and in the production and reception of art, and further that these two roles should somehow be understood in relation to each other, is an important one. This volume largely juxtaposes these two topics rather than bringing them fully into engagement with each other. In order to accomplish that mutual engagement, one might need to turn, as I have suggested, to more contemporary work on imagination that is less beholden to the 'mental mechanics' of transcendental psychology and that integrates aesthetics and the philosophy of mind somewhat apart from its terms. (The work of R. G. Collingwood[6] and Charles Taylor[7] comes to mind here, along with Walton and Wollheim.) But we can be grateful to the German Idealists and Romantics for opening up the topics of the imagination and the connection between art and mind, and to this volume for investigating that opening.

[1] Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, ed. and trans. Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), A78=B103, p. 211.

[2] Keren Gorodeisky and Eric Marcus, "Aesthetic Rationality," The Journal of Philosophy CXV, 3 (March 2018), pp. 113-140.

[3] Michael N. Forster, German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2018), and Herder's Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2018).

[4] Stanley Cavell, "Aesthetic Problems of Modern Philosophy," in Cavell, Must We Mean What We Say? 2d. ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002), p. 91. On Cavell on "forms of life" as having both a vertical-'biological' dimension and a horizontal, historical-cultural dimension, see Cavell, This New Yet Unapproachable America (Albuquerque: Living Batch Press, 1989), pp. 41-44.

[5] Kristin Gjesdal, Gadamer and the Legacy of German Idealism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009). Chapter 5, pp. 155-184 treats Schleiermacher.

[6] R. G. Collingwood, The Principles of Art (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1938) includes a systematic theory of productive imagination, developing and integrating materials from Locke, Berkeley, Hume, Kant, and Hegel, all in connection with a theory of art.

[7] Charles Taylor, The Language Animal (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2016) contains Taylor's fullest mature statement of the role of imagination, along with training in language, in experience generally, and in the experience of art.