The Imagination in Hume's Philosophy: The Canvas of the Mind

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Timothy M. Costelloe, The Imagination in Hume's Philosophy: The Canvas of the Mind, Edinburgh University Press, 2018, 312pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474436397.

Reviewed by Christopher Williams, University of Nevada, Reno


If we ask what the imagination is for Hume, there are two ways of taking the question. We could be asking about the objects of a mental faculty, and the answer would be "ideas" (entertainable thoughts, which contrast with the impressions of sense as well as the recollections of memory). Or we could be asking about the actions that the faculty performs, and here the answer, assuming a different shape, would be "the association of ideas," with easy transitions between, and completions of unions among, the objects of the faculty. Both ways of addressing the question are needed for understanding Hume, who calls upon the imagination to do a lot of work, and work of different kinds, in his philosophy. Timothy Costelloe offers a unified and comprehensive treatment of Hume's thinking about the imagination, and his term 'canvas of the mind', which summons images of the marks on the canvas as well as the act of marking, flavorfully completes a union of the two crucial motifs.

The first chapter ("Hume's Imagination") lays out two powers of the imagination, what Costelloe calls the "mimetic" (consisting in the copying of impressions as ideas) and the "productive" (consisting in either the combination of ideas we already have or the creation of new ones). False representations of various kinds are possible for the imagination, but apart from imaginings that are mistaken for memories, error is a significant issue only for the productive imagination. These errors are fictions, which can be either artificial (in the case of winged horses and the like) or vulgar (in the case of natural belief about bodies around us). The fictions are often imaginatively attractive, and our susceptibility to being beguiled by them provides an organizational thread for the wide-ranging discussion in the remainder of the book, inasmuch as the easy transitions of ideas that are characteristic of the imaginative operation are best explained by the supposition that "the faculty of imagination is fundamentally hedonistic, an insight that effectively unifies under a single principle a wide range of different tendencies that might otherwise appear as ad hoc and unrelated" (22).

The chapters that follow chart the activity of the imagination in assorted domains, and it is convenient to divide them into groups. The first pair deal with core elements from Treatise Books One and Three (and the two Enquiries). We first have a chapter on "Metaphysics" in which many fictions make an appearance, including both those that Hume himself labels explicitly as such (e.g., continued and distinct existence) and those that he does not (e.g., contra-causal freedom of the will). Much of the material here will be recognizable to readers for whom the role of skepticism in Hume's thought is a special interest, though the skeptical dialectic itself is absent (at this stage of discussion). And then we have a chapter, necessarily more selective in its purview, on "Morals and Politics" that explores the adoption of a general point of view in moral judgment, the mechanism of sympathy, and the rules that determine property.

In the next brace of chapters, Costelloe concentrates on the imagination in relationship to the understanding of texts. Taking the artificial fictions of the poet as its central datum, the first of these ("Aesthetics") seeks to show how the poet "subverts" experience (145, 146, 152, 154) in order to produce agreeable belief-mimicking effects, and to identify three rules of art -- plausibility, unity, and simplicity -- that are "tantamount to techniques" (161) for securing an audience's uptake of a poetical fiction. (That the center of gravity in this chapter is not "Of the Standard of Taste" is a touch that refreshingly invites us to approach Hume's aesthetic theory more from the standpoint of the creator than the critic.) Then we consider (in "History") the texts whose audiences read them as true accounts of the past; here the creator's task involves the exercise of imagination because the past is only indirectly (which is to say, purely imaginatively) available to us and yet the historian's work needs to make mere ideas vividly present if we are to believe the text we are reading and therefore not regard it as equivalent to a poetical fiction. On behalf of the historian, Costelloe offers a statement of "three rules of historical art," which shadow the rules for literary art, but since the historian is not trying to be entertainingly believable but to be believed, the standards for these rules are higher.

The final two chapters, on "Religion" and "Philosophy," juxtapose those ever-quarrelsome siblings, and Costelloe is indeed at pains to exhibit family resemblances. In the case of each item, there is a distinction between a true and a false version: false religion and false philosophy traffic in appealing but problematic fictions, whereas true religion and true philosophy avoid the problems but leave little imaginative satisfaction. The ideas of religion and philosophy are of course different, but the differences recede in the light of this formal similarity, which is essentially the "antinomy" that Costelloe diagnoses for religion (248-251) and philosophy (275-282). Talk of antinomies summons the spirits of skeptical impasse and apparently gives them the last word on the imagination: although we cannot live without it, obviously, we cannot live with it, at least reflectively.

This book tackles an important (and insufficiently investigated) topic in Hume. Advanced students of Hume's philosophical psychology will profit from reading Costelloe; and the greatest reward, to my mind, is to be found in the mutually illuminating chapters on literature and history that constitute the centerpiece of the book. There is moreover a wealth of reference. Prospective readers should be aware, however, that Costelloe sometimes has a penchant for making corroborative allusions to multiple secondary sources in a short space; and this can make for hard going unless one is already well versed in the literature with which he is conversant. The book is best suited for careful consultation, not casual browsing.

That said, there are reasons for a reader to tread a little cautiously when relying on Costelloe to get a handle on the basic architecture of Hume's imagination. My concerns begin with the seemingly straightforward contrast between the mimetic and the productive imagination at the outset. The choice to call the imagination mimetic is unusual because the notion of imitation is more than just a matter of representationally replicating the content of sense impressions; it is also a matter of approximating the impressions, becoming like them in their operation. Hume does not use the term 'mimetic', but the concept is present in the section of the Treatise called "Of the influence of belief" (T 1.3.10, a section the book does not discuss), where he says that the ideas that we believe, in contrast to mere fancies, imitate the effect of impressions on the will. Properly speaking, only some ideas are impression-mimetic for Hume, and to speak as if all of them are is apt to be misleading.

As for the other side of Costelloe's contrast, the imagination qua productive, the risks go beyond that of being misled. To stress productive activities as the different chapters repeatedly do tends to direct the reader's attention to the contriving of fictions, and to do so at the expense of activities that are not in an interesting sense productive. Consequently, the exegesis intimates more fictions for our minds to negotiate than are dreamt of in Hume's philosophy.

To give concrete shape to this observation, suppose that I saw a cat yesterday. Today I remember having seen that cat, and memory is not productive. But suppose I think about the cat, separately from the recollected perceptual episode: what it is doing, where it is, and so on. Or if yesterday was my first occasion for contact with cats, I might think about what it is to be a cat, relying on the idea with which my encounter yesterday equipped me. Now these ideas today are not memories and so are imaginings by default. But it is not clear how the imagination has done anything interestingly productive -- more productive than what memory does -- when I have these ideas, some of which may be believed, some entertained as possible candidates for belief, and some merely entertained for the sheer pleasure of entertaining them.

Here's the rub. Soon after introducing the imagination, Hume says that "nothing is more free than that faculty" (T; SBN 10). It is quite natural to take this freedom to be the freedom of arbitrary idea-construction, as Hume's own initial illustrations of the faculty confirm. But the freedom of the imagination is also, and more fundamentally, a freedom from the constraints of present (or remembered) sense impressions, as Hume's subsequent and relatively un-self-conscious employment of the concept of imagination in fact likewise confirms. If we restrict ourselves to the visual imagination, Hume models the imagination on the sense of sight: it is similar to sight, but not confined to the body-bound conditions that govern literal sightings, even if (as Hume reminds us) "the imagination can never totally forget the points of space and time, in which we are existent" (T; SBN 427). It is this imaginative freedom in this sense, and the sense-perception model that both clarifies and constrains that freedom, that comes less plainly into focus in Costelloe's treatment.

Hume's remark about space and time, drawn from a Treatise section that, surprisingly, the book does not examine, does suggest different emphases. It may be, as Costelloe maintains, that the historian writes narratives that the mind receives as if they were literary fictions, and that the historian has to meet extra requirements in order to be believed. But it may be that the explanation would go more fruitfully in the other direction, that the narrative poet writes texts that the mind receives as if they were histories, and that the writer needs markers in the text to inhibit belief. If an alternative picture such as this is mistaken, it would more fully realize the ambitions of the book to know why.

A preoccupation with fictions is perhaps the real underwriter of the idea that the imagination sometimes "subverts" experience, since one might instead suppose, less tendentiously, that the imagination allows us to have experience -- our experience, that is to say, not the kind had by the beasts whose minds "rest . . . in the narrow circle of objects, which are the subject of daily conversation and action" (T; SBN 271). And that preoccupation encourages one to affix the fiction label more freely than one should. For instance, Hume does think that property is the "offspring of the sentiments" (T; SBN 509), in regard to which fancy is the reliable other parent, but nothing is gained by saying that the "rules of property are fictions, ideas not traceable to experience and matter of fact" (130). Property relations are artificial, but this is merely to affirm that they do not exist naturally, prior to the activity of minds that make them experiential and matter-of-factual.

For Costelloe's Hume, finally, there is also a whiff of danger in connection with the overtures of the imagination, and a stronger whiff than that which Hume's writings arguably support. To a considerable extent, the suspicion that the imagination is a dangerous faculty depends on, or is reinforced by, the personification of the imagination as a "hedonist." Yet the thought that pleasure motivates the imagination just seems wrong. The imagination is pleased by certain transitions (namely, easy ones), but that claim is not tantamount to saying that the transitions are made with having pleasure as their object. Once again, the sense-perception model is worth keeping in view: certain things are agreeable to our sight, but it is not as though the sense of sight aims at agreeable sensations, as it were. If "every thing, which is agreeable to the senses, is also in some measure agreeable to the fancy" (T; SBN 358), we need not be saying anything grander than that the imagination finds some moves easier than others. Pleasure thus need not be regarded, in such a light, as a seduction to which we are exposed because our pleasure-seeking imagination has inveigled us.