The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought; Volume I, Philosophy and Natural Sciences

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Karl Ameriks (ed.), The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought;  Volume I, Philosophy and Natural Sciences, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 447pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107039827.

Reviewed by Michael Forster, University of Bonn


This is the first volume of an ambitious four-volume project, with Nicholas Boyle and Liz Disley as general editors, that is intended to provide a reasonably comprehensive account of the legacy of post-Kantian German Idealism. The present volume focuses on "philosophy and natural sciences." Subsequent volumes will focus on social, political, and moral philosophy, together with gender studies (vol. 2); literature, literary theory, and aesthetics (vol. 3); and biblical, systematic, and moral theology (vol. 4).

This volume opens with introductory materials of various sorts: The 'grand old man' of modern scholarship on German Idealism, Dieter Henrich, launches the ship with a few words in which he judges that although the German Idealists' specific conclusions and manner of presenting them are unsuccessful, the enormous body of issues that they first raised is "still fundamentally unchanged," including "the vision of a totality in which insight and ethical orientation are combined," and notes that an additional task of understanding what they were doing has since arisen as well (xvi). He expresses satisfaction with the level at which these several tasks are currently being pursued and welcomes the present project in particular.

Next is a general introduction concerning the 18th and 19th centuries by Nicholas Boyle, followed by one on the 20th and 21st centuries by Liz Disley. Boyle sensibly chooses to interpret the expression 'German Idealism' not as a name for a certain philosophical thesis but rather as "historical shorthand . . . for the principal philosophers who were part of the remarkable cultural efflorescence in Germany at the end of the eighteenth and beginning of the nineteenth centuries." The philosophers are "Kant, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel and Schopenhauer, and -- more controversially, perhaps -- some components of the work of such major literary contemporaries of these as Goethe, Schiller, Hölderlin and Friedrich Schlegel" (3). Boyle then discusses in some historical detail the background and aftermath of German Idealism in Germany, its relation to Anglophone thought -- the latter both as a cause (e.g. Locke and Hume) and as an effect (e.g. Coleridge, Carlyle, American Idealism, and British Idealism) -- and, finally, its impact in other parts of the world (especially Russia, France, and Italy). Disley surveys movements in the 20th and 21st centuries that owe significant debts to German Idealism. These include Phenomenology, the Frankfurt School, Existentialism, Postmodernism (Foucault and Derrida), neo-Hegelianism, Analytic Philosophy, Communitarianism, and Feminism.

These two introductory panoramas are for the most part very helpful. However, they do involve several unfortunate omissions and marginalizations. The first, and perhaps most grievous, is Boyle's marginalization of the proto-Romantics Hamann, Herder, and Goethe and the Romantics themselves, mainly on the grounds that Jena Romanticism, while it "undoubtedly showed some philosophical originality, would be better termed 'the literary school of German Idealism'" (5). This view is certainly conventional but also happens to be quite false. It was mainly Herder and his philosophical pupil Goethe who, by embracing Spinoza's philosophy (already in the 1770s, i.e. long before the so-called 'pantheism controversy' of the mid-1780s), laid the foundations for the neo-Spinozist monistic metaphysics that is shared by both the leading Romantics (especially Schleiermacher and  Friedrich Schlegel) and the leading post-Kantian Idealists (Schelling and Hegel). Hegel's philosophies of mind and history largely derived from Herder as well, and his epistemology largely from Friedrich Schlegel (specifically the latter's lectures on transcendental philosophy from 1800-1). The still widespread perception that the (proto-)Romantics lacked the systematic rigor of their German Idealist contemporaries and were therefore not 'real' philosophers rests on mistaking what was in fact a deeply motivated (and indeed, probably correct) anti-systematicity, based largely on their perception that system-building invariably turns out to be implausible in its actual execution and moreover distorts or inhibits empirical inquiry (an anti-systematicity that was subsequently inherited and continued by Nietzsche and the later Wittgenstein) for mere unsystematicity. Far from being merely 'literary,' they in fact made revolutionary theoretical contributions in areas such as philosophy of language, linguistics, hermeneutics, and translation-theory. And they thereby exercised a massive and beneficial influence on the development of the humanities and social sciences as well, including virtually establishing not only of all the modern fields just mentioned but also such additional ones as philology (Boeckh was a student of Schleiermacher), the methodology of historiography (Droysen and Dilthey both founded this on Schleiermacher's hermeneutics), and cultural anthropology (Boas and Malinowski were both deeply rooted in the relevant German tradition). So this is no minor omission!

Second, Boyle's 40-page introduction devotes a mere four sentences to German Idealism's influence on the Left Hegelians and in particular Marx (17-18) despite the fact that this is arguably one of its most important influences. The same tendency to marginalize Marx -- a philosopher, but also one with at least a serious claim to be scientific -- continues in the rest of the volume as well (for example, the article on Hegel's influence on French philosophy basically skips over the Marxist Kojève). One only hopes that the additional volumes in the project will redress this imbalance.

Third, neither Boyle nor Disley pays significant attention to Neo-Kantianism. (Fortunately the first article, by Michael Friedman, makes up for this.)

Fourth, one might have expected a project on the "impact" of a philosophical movement such as German Idealism to cover not only the good news but also the bad (as it were), but these introductions conspicuously fail to do so. Examples of the darker side of German Idealism arguably include, in addition to its overambitious systematic pretentions, its apriorism, its perpetuation of religious, and in particular Christian, myths long after these had been discredited by the French and British Enlightenment, its occasional nationalism (Fichte's Speeches to the German Nation), and its occasional racism and anti-semitism (here the main culprit is Kant).

Complementing these concerns about omissions, one might also reasonably complain that some of what is emphasized in the general introductory material (and in this first volume as a whole) is emphasized to an unfortunate degree and in unfortunate ways. For example, both Boyle's introduction and the volume as a whole focus so heavily on the (roots and) impact of German Idealism in the Anglophone world that much of its -- surely equally fascinating -- impact in Germany gets squeezed out. Concerning the introductory material, a few examples of this squeezing out have already been mentioned above, but there are many others as well, such as the influence of German Idealism on the neutral monism concerning mind and matter that became so popular in Germany among both philosophers and scientists (e.g. Haeckel) throughout the 19th century, on the (philosophy of) mathematics and logic (e.g. Cantor's theory of the transfinite and Frege's theories of both mathematics and logic), and on Gadamer's hermeneutics. This problem is even more severe for the individual articles in the present volume.

Moreover, not only are the Left Hegelian critics of religion marginalized, but also the introductory materials and the individual articles (especially the one on Scottish Idealism) take a strikingly uncritical or even positive attitude to German Idealism's religious, and in particular Christian, side -- an attitude that to some of us at least will seem atavistic and regrettable.

After the general introductory materials, the editor , Karl Ameriks, gives a brief summary of, and commentary on, the individual articles. His very lucid and helpful remarks will help considerably to orientate readers.

Next come the individual articles, starting with Michael Friedman's impressive piece on the philosophy of natural science in German Idealism and Neo-Kantianism. Friedman points out that Kant's philosophy of science implied a profound skepticism about our knowledge of phenomena (especially, but not exclusively, in biology). He then interprets Schelling's philosophy of nature sympathetically as a response to this problem, a response that was based on sensitivity to a range of new developments in the natural sciences. He goes on to explain Helmholtz's Kantian-Newtonian reply to this philosophy of nature, as well as Helmholtz's own appropriation and (physiological) modification of Kant's theory of space. Finally, he explores the form of Neo-Kantianism developed by Cohen and Cassirer, one that again attempted to save the spirit of Kant's theory of space, this time in the face of the new developments in mathematics and physics that had by then called it into question.

This article is extremely informative and interesting. My only cavil (a minor one) is that the conception of the synthetic a priori that Cassirer attempts to vindicate seems far removed from what Kant had meant by the expression and that more could have been done to make the difference clear.

Robert J. Richards discusses the impact of German Idealism and Romanticism on the philosophy of biology in the 19th century. (Incidentally, his emphasis in doing so on the proto-Romantics Herder and Goethe and the semi-Romantic Schelling reveals yet another reason why it is a mistake to marginalize Romanticism as merely 'literary.') Richards points out that Herder's Ideas for a Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91) already contained proto-evolutionary principles (108) and that Goethe (Herder's philosophical pupil) and Schelling went on to develop ideas about morphology and evolution that would prove to be fundamental for subsequent 19th-century developments (108-13). In particular, Richards shows that Owen and Darwin were both influenced by Goethe's ideas about morphology, with Darwin taking them in a developmental or evolutionary direction (117-22). And he shows that in another reflection of his Romantic heritage Darwin (rather contrary to his reputation as the thinker who eliminated purposiveness from nature) in works up to and even including the Origin of Species (1859) thought of evolution in teleological terms, with humankind and its morality as the telos, or purpose, in question (126-30).

This account (which Richards has already developed at greater length in his The Romantic Conception of Life, 2002) is extremely illuminating and convincing. My only caveat is that it would have been interesting to hear more about Darwin's next phase, when he really did eliminate purposiveness from nature (thus completing a skepticism about its presence there that goes back to Kant). Was this a result of his increasing loss of faith in God (as reported in his Autobiography), was it the other way round (i.e. that he came to see that purposiveness had been explained away so that God was no longer a required hypothesis), or was it a bit of both of these things?

Sebastian Gardner develops the thesis that it was really post-Kantian German Idealism that formed the basis for Freud's conception of the unconscious. Kant did not yet really achieve this (156-8), but Fichte (138-140), Novalis (142-4), Schelling (144-7), Hegel (147-8), and Schopenhauer (148) developed the idea that the self's self-relation involves an aspect of self-occlusion. This idea -- together with Hartmann's new epistemological grounding for it in a more positivistic principle of inference (from observable behavior) to the best explanation (149-50) -- provided the foundations for Freud's theory. Gardner then goes on to argue not only that Freud's theory had this source but also that many of its problems are due to his having dropped key aspects of the Idealists' position, in particular their theory of self-consciousness and the normativity that they built into it (151-6). To illustrate this, Gardner examines the inadequacies of the Freudian theory of sublimation and suggests that a neo-Idealist correction would be required in order to eliminate them (156-7).

This is an extremely informative and interesting article, but I have a few reservations about it. First, it seems to me that Gardner's attempt to interpret the post-Kantian Idealists as the main source of Freud's unconscious is an exaggeration. In this connection, Gardner himself rightly mentions Leibniz's petites perceptions (141) and (though only in a footnote) Kant's remark in the Anthropology that the great majority of our mental states are unconscious (160). Moreover, there were other important early theorists of the unconscious, including Herder (in a seminal work on the philosophy of mind from 1778) and both of the Schlegel brothers. The truth, I think, is that already beginning with the Rationalists the unconscious became a virtual commonplace of German philosophy. Second, Gardner seems to me to underestimate the importance of Nietzsche, and especially The Gay Science, for the development of the details of Freud's theory (150-1) (incidentally, a fact that probably again points to the importance of German (Proto-)Romanticism, which very heavily influenced Nietzsche). Third, somewhat contrary to Gardner's philosophical narrative, the genealogy of the idea of the unconscious that he traces overlooks a significant negative affinity between the German Idealist versions of it and that of Freud: just as Idealists such as Fichte and Schelling had run into severe epistemological/justificatory problems in positing an unconscious level of the self (notwithstanding their own anti-skeptical ambitions in doing so), so, later on, did Freud (despite his official good intentions concerning justification by means of an inference to the best explanation). This problem is indeed so severe in Freud's case that it seems plausible to say that his own original contributions (i.e. those that go beyond what he takes over from his predecessors) -- e.g. his thesis that dreams are always wish-fulfillment, that the same is true of poetry, and that children are always subject to an Oedipus Complex -- are little more than unjustified and implausible myths.

Christian J. Emden explores Kant and Nietzsche on teleology. He notes that Kant already demoted teleological explanations of natural organisms to a merely regulative status, points out that Darwin then replaced the concept of purpose in such cases with that of a function relative to a specific environmental context, and argues that Nietzsche then inherited this position (166-73). In addition, he argues that Nietzsche -- influenced by Hume and Kant -- similarly demoted efficient causality to a mere regulative principle, one that is grounded in our desires for comforting explanations and for power (173-7). But he also notes that Nietzsche tended in his later works to reintroduce teleological principles (e.g. "will to power"), and he explains this puzzling step in terms of the later Nietzsche's welcoming of useful illusions.

This article is less well written than the others. But its tracing of the two Nietzschean positions in question back to Kant is valuable and could indeed be extended to include further Nietzschean positions as well.

Robert Hanna argues that the roots of 19th- and 20th-century Phenomenology and its concept of intentionality lie in Kant, not in medieval philosophy (as has often been thought). Hanna indeed reads Kant's transcendental idealism as a solution to what he calls the metaphysical problem of intentionality -- i.e. the problem of explaining the relationship between intentional acts and intentional contents and their objects (192) -- reading Kant's famous letter to Marcus Herz from 1772 as an early indication of such a project (193-206). Hanna then interprets Brentano's theory of the mind and intentionality as basically Kantian, with the one qualification that unlike Kant Brentano retains an allegiance to a Cartesian conception of 'privileged access' (212-14), as later does Husserl (219) -- a retrograde step, in Hanna's view, that leads to an implausibly strong version of transcendental idealism rather than the weaker version that he himself emphatically prefers (220). Finally, Hanna makes a case for this weaker version of transcendental idealism as a solution to the metaphysical problem of intentionality (220-1).

This is a stimulating article, and I believe that much in it is right. However, [1] it was probably not so much Kant himself who played the crucial role in preparing the ground for Phenomenology and its principle of intentionality but rather a model of the essential structure of consciousness that he adumbrated in the Transcendental Deduction. According to that model, taken over and further developed by Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel, and others, all consciousness requires self-consciousness, consciousness of a representation, and consciousness of an object. [2] The problem of how (a certain kind of) representation can refer to objects was indeed one of the problems that Kant's transcendental idealism was designed to solve, and the letter to Herz does indeed show this. But to reduce the motivation of transcendental idealism to this single motive is a great oversimplification since it omits such further key motives as, for example, solving the mystery of the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge (in both mathematics and metaphysics) and resolving the antinomies. [3] The problem from the letter to Herz to which Kant responds with his transcendental idealism is really only half of the metaphysical problem of intentionality, namely a problem concerning how representations can refer to existent objects, not the (perhaps even deeper) problem concerning how they can be about objects at all, whether existent or not (e.g. unicorns or Zeus). So transcendental idealism only seems to offer an answer to half of the problem. [4] Moreover, this answer is in fact a (quasi-)causal one, and therefore seems to imply just the strong version of transcendental idealism that Hanna wants to avoid. Furthermore, whether the answer is correct or not remains (partly for just that reason) very much an open question.

Daniel O. Dahlstrom argues that in Being and Time (1927) Heidegger tried to develop a version of Kantian transcendental idealism (225-30), but, in the 1930s, came to equate idealism with forgetfulness of Being, tracing its origins back to Plato (230-2). Heidegger's critique of Hegel's absolute idealism in particular accuses Hegel of making a plurality of beings fundamental, rather than Being in the singular, and in sharp contrast to the subject (an accusation that, as Dahlstrom himself notes, is difficult to make much sense of) (235-42). But Heidegger himself implicitly remains a sort of idealist (242).

Just a couple of points about this interesting article. [1] If Heidegger is a Kantian transcendental idealist at all in Being and Time (which one may reasonably doubt), then he is surely one who has already taken over a whole series of positions from Hegel as well. These include: a goal of overcoming subject-object dualism (in Dasein), an ambition to overcome the dualism of cognition vs. action as well, a thesis of the essentially interpretive and linguistic nature of all human mental life, a thesis that the individual is essentially embedded in society, a thesis of historicity, and, more specifically, a thesis of a historical fall from a unitary Absolute/Being into dualism/beings. [2] This situation helps to explain why Heidegger so severely misinterprets Hegel when he criticizes him: he is attempting to mask the extent and depth of his debts to Hegel in order to create an impression of his own originality by imputing to Hegel, and faulting him for, doctrines that are diametrically opposed to the ones that they in fact both share.

Gary Gutting discusses the French reception of Hegel. He begins with Jean Wahl's book from 1929 on the "Unhappy Consciousness" theme in the Phenomenology of Spirit, which Wahl tries to use as a basis for interpreting the whole work (247-9). Stepping quickly over Kojève's subsequent, somewhat similar but better known, neo-Marxist reading of the "Lordship and Bondage" theme in the Phenomenology, Gutting then focuses on Jean Hyppolite's two books concerned with the Phenomenology: The Genesis and Structure of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (1946) and Logic and Existence (1953). As Gutting explains, these two books, respectively, correct the one-sidedness of Wahl's and Kojève's readings and emphasize the linguistic character of Hegel's position, culminating with a puzzle about how the human language that Hegel has in view in the Phenomenology is supposed to relate to the conceptual structure of his Logic (249-54). Gutting then discusses several reactions to Hegel which in part responded to Hyppolite's reading: Sartre's existentialist and then existentialist-Marxist appropriations of Hegel (254-6); Foucault's search for a non-Hegelian philosophy, in particular one that forgoes Hegelian dialectic, which eventually leads him to adopt Nietzsche's method of genealogy (257-64); and Deleuze's critique of Hegel for positing contradictions within the Absolute rather than merely difference, a critique that becomes the starting-point for Deleuze's own philosophical project (264-9).

This article constitutes an extremely informative and illuminating survey of French responses to Hegel generally and the Phenomenology in particular. My only caveats concern certain omissions: It would have been interesting to have heard more about 19th-century French responses to Hegel (especially Victor Cousin). Also, as I have already implied, Kojève -- whose strength as an interpreter of Hegel's Phenomenology seems to me to have been seriously underestimated in the Anglophone world -- would have deserved more detailed coverage.

David Fergusson discusses the impact of German Idealism in Scotland during the 19th century, especially its impact on James Ferrier, Edward Caird, John Caird, and A.S. Pringle-Pattison (originally Andrew Seth). Fergusson also argues, contrary to received wisdom, that the influence of German Idealism in Scotland continued well into the 20th century (293-4).

This article is a good piece of intellectual history. It is not likely to excite philosophers much. The ideas of the Scottish thinkers in question are too unoriginal, and in most cases also fused with a rather tedious commitment to orthodox Christianity, specifically Presbyterianism. But there is at least one mystery here that may intrigue all readers: How did Andrew Seth become A.S. Pringle-Pattison?!

Robert Stern discusses the idea found in the British Idealists, Green and Bradley, that moral obligation derives from "my station and its duties." Stern notes that according to a common reading of this position it has what he calls an 'identificatory' character, grounding moral obligation in the fact that social roles and their attendant duties constitute a person's very identity. But he argues that neither Green nor Bradley actually held such a view. Instead, Green held a broadly Kantian view of moral obligation, which Stern calls a 'hybrid' view because it combines a theory of right with a separate theory of moral obligation, while Bradley held a Hegelian view, which Stern refers to as a 'social command' view because it grounds moral obligation in the very fact that the society to which one belongs requires certain things of one. After explaining this interpretation in general outline, Stern begins with a sketch of Kant's and Hegel's own theories of moral obligation (302-6), then argues against the 'identificatory' reading of Green and Bradley and for the alternative readings that he advocates (307-18). In the case of Bradley, he argues in particular that Bradley's 'identificatory'-sounding remarks are not in fact meant to ground moral obligation but merely to defuse certain individualistic objections to his 'social command' account of it.

This is a very interesting and illuminating article. My only reservation concerns its denial of an 'identificatory' position to Bradley: such a position need not be incompatible with a 'social command' position but may rather serve to ground it, and this seems to me to be not only Bradley's intention but also that of his model, Hegel, especially in the Phenomenology (where Hegel famously writes of an "'I' that is 'We,' and 'We' that is 'I'" before going on to present his 'social command' account at the end of the Reason chapter).

Peter Hylton considers the relation between analytic philosophy and German Idealism. He points out that analytic philosophy has two main roots: first, Frege and his Germanic successors, and second, Moore and Russell. He argues that (somewhat ironically) whereas the latter were directly influenced by Idealism, having begun their philosophical careers committed to it, the former were not. More precisely, he argues that whereas in Britain Kant tended to be read as an idealist, in Germany he tended to be read as an epistemologist, and that while Frege was indeed influenced by Kant, he was not influenced by post-Kantian Idealism (326-8). On Hylton's interpretation a key move towards the emergence of analytic philosophy occurred when the young Moore, an idealist up to that point, challenged the idealist thesis that the conditions of knowledge are also conditions of the objects of knowledge (230) -- a move which then led to a series of further moves by both Moore and Russell away from idealism and in the direction of analytic philosophy (324-40).

This is a very illuminating article. As it happens, I have recently argued against the conventional view adopted here by Hylton that Frege was not influenced by post-Kantian Idealism -- specifically, I have argued that it was no accident that after many centuries of relative stagnation in logic the revolution in logic that Frege effected at the University of Jena in the latter half of the 19th century had been preceded by Hegel's attempt to revolutionize logic at the same university at the beginning of the century and that Frege's famous attack on Erdmann in the preface to the Basic Laws of Arithmetic (1893) turns out to be largely a veiled attack on Hegelian positions. But this interpretation is, and will no doubt remain, controversial.

Dina Emundts explores the relationship between American Pragmatism and German Idealism. She finds the relationship ambivalent: Peirce, James, and Dewey are all indebted to German Idealism, especially to Hegel's Phenomenology, but they also criticize it for being too apriorist (and metaphysical) and insufficiently oriented to experience (347-50). However, Emundts also defends Hegel against this charge. In this connection, she focuses on Peirce's famous 1903 lectures, showing that they owe a serious debt to Hegel's Phenomenology but also arguing that Peirce's main objection to Hegel, namely that he eliminates what Peirce calls 'Firstness,' or presentness, in favor of 'Thirdness,' or representation/concepts, involves a misinterpretation of Hegel's position, as do several further objections that Peirce raises against Hegel (350-68).

This is a very interesting and helpful article. My only caveat (a modest one) is that while Emundts seems right in the end to see Peirce's main objection to Hegel as based on a misreading, this is at least a misreading to which the Phenomenology provides very strong temptations since the work's official project is one of thoroughly discrediting the "experience" of the ordinary consciousness in order thereby to justify a transition to the Logic and its treatment of pure concepts.

Finally, Robert Pippin, in a broad-ranging article on Reason in Kant, argues that a standard 'impositional' reading of Kant's theoretical and practical philosophies is only superficially correct (373-7). According to Pippin, perception cannot be a matter of making myriad quick implicit judgments, nor moral judgment a matter of implicitly applying Kant's universalizability test; moreover, Kant does not really claim that these things are the case (376-9). Instead, Pippin picks up on Kant's famous "same function" passage at A79 in the Critique of Pure Reason in order to develop a Sellars-inspired reading of Kant's position on perception (along similar lines to those already suggested by John McDowell): the same cognitive capacity is involved in perception and conceptualization, but this does not imply that perception itself involves conceptualization (384-6). Pippin then goes on to argue that an analogous account can be given of Kant's conception of moral judgment (368-9). He acknowledges that the resulting account of moral judgment seems to conflict with certain passages in Kant, but he notes that there are other passages, especially in the Religion, which point toward the sort of rapprochement between (moral) inclination and the universalizability test that this account implies (389-92).

This is a very interesting and thought-provoking article. As Pippin is the first to admit, it is not entirely clear that the positions he attributes to Kant are really held by him. But Kant definitely says certain things that could warrant attributing those positions to him. And perhaps more importantly, the positions are intrinsically plausible. I do have one reservation, however. Both in the theoretical and in the practical cases, the positions in question seem to be susceptible to, and indeed to cry out for, empirical confirmation or disconfirmation: in the theoretical case by empirical psychology, in the practical case by a hermeneutically sensitive interpretation of people's moral judgments. Pippin does not seem sufficiently aware of this fact. Moreover, in the only case where he himself invokes empirical considerations in this spirit, namely in relation to the question of whether animals ever really correct themselves (as shown, for example, by manifesting embarrassment over a mistake) (383), he gives a negative answer based on his experience with his own dog that is both (a) methodologically unsound (induction from a single example -- or at best, a single limited type of examples -- to a very general conclusion) and (b) in fact mistaken (for example, the cognitive ethology literature on chimpanzees is full of cases of self-correction).

In sum, while there are indeed some problems with the conception of the overall project to which this volume belongs and with the conception of the volume itself, both the introductory materials and its individual articles provide a wealth of thoughtful, informative, and stimulating reflections on German Idealism. It is therefore warmly welcomed and recommended.