The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, Volume II: Historical, Social and Political Thought

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John Walker (ed.), The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, Volume II: Historical, Social and Political Thought, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 397pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107039834.

Reviewed by Tatjana Sheplyakova, Goethe University Frankfurt


This collection is part of the long-term international project that brought together 52 researchers from Europe and North America to provide the first comprehensive survey of the impact of German Idealism on science, religion, sociology and the humanities. The project resulted in four volumes with Nicholas Boyle and Liz Disley as general editors. The other volumes are Philosophy and Natural Sciences (vol. I), Aesthetics and Literature (vol. III), and Religion (vol. IV).

John Walker, editor of Volume II, opens with a concise but informative "Introduction: Idealism in historical, social and political thought" that sets out the volume's core concerns and gives a short summary of each of its articles. He begins with an elegant polemic against Benedetto Croce's dictum at the beginning of the twentieth century that Hegel's philosophy of history, politics and the state was "most constrained by the cultural idiom of its time" (1) and must therefore be declared "most dead" and incapable of accounting for "urgent concerns of the modern world" (2). Walker challenges this view by stating the opposite: In a world that simultaneously grows together and apart, that at once faces unprecedented technological expansion and globalization and is fragmented into a "multiplicity of culturally specific . . . narratives of human identity" (2), German idealism continues to have a major impact on sciences of experience. He argues, however, that we would seriously misconceive the very meaning of Idealism unless its living presence is captured in terms of "a continuous dialectic: one whose idea continues to be relevant only if it is never reified, as its terms are constantly redefined through actual experience" (2).

This methodological approach sets a high bar for the contributors who are called on to address this complex dialectic in and across three dimensions: within the movement of Idealism itself, with reference to its reception and in various appropriations of its ideas in contemporary social and political thought (5). The result is an impressive fifteen essays that proceed chronologically and thematically. Following an engagement with the legacy of Enlightenment thought within Idealism, the reader is thematically relocated to the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, where reflections of Idealism in Neo-Kantianism and in Lebensphilosophie, in sociology and in Frankfurt School 'critical theory' are traced. The next part deals with the uses and abuses of Hegel's philosophy in German neo-Hegelian legal theory and among legal scholars in fascist Italy, while the subsequent essays are devoted to philosophy of gender. The volume closes with a piece on the "German tradition of meta-history" -- an elegant decision given that it starts with a reflection on the Kantian notion of history.

Onora O'Neill's "From transcendental idealism to political realism", addresses one of the central conundrums of Kant scholarship: how the spheres of knowledge and practice relate to history and politics in Kant's transcendental philosophy. O'Neill first sketches Kant's project of transcendental idealism and goes on to show that Kant seems to have abandoned his transcendental idealist approach in the field of politics and history. In reaction to the disagreement over whether to locate Kant as a political realist or idealist, she suggests that temporality is the bridge between the two different modes of practical commitments that oscillate between utility and freedom: while the orientation towards the future is something to hope and to work for, "prudence in action" relies on a reflection of "means-ends relationships" (22).

O'Neill's focus on temporality is highly interesting, and yet, it seems to fall short of grasping the distinctive quality of emancipatory events in history. Such events reveal themselves not so much in their temporal quality but in the transformed nature of our affect. Jean-François Lyotard took up this Kantian idea. In his lecture "Enthusiasm: The Kantian Critique of History", Lyotard suggested focusing on the passages between the realm of ideas and the realm of experience in Kant's philosophy, "passages that to be sure are not bridges."1 The omission of Lyotard in O'Neill's essay is of course perfectly consistent with her argument. However, instead of advocating the compatibility of idealism and political realism, we could as well acknowledge that for Kant the idea of progress in history indeed never converges with the actual practice and can only be thought of from the vantage point of a radically undetermined future that blasts the notion of temporality itself.

In "The public of the intellectuals -- from Kant to Lyotard", William Rasch makes up for this omission to a certain extent. Against the background of the Kantian storyline of the perfectibility of humanity as a whole in the process of history, he focuses on the public intellectuals' role in the project of modernity. In their function as educators, intellectuals are entrusted with the task of "supervising the use of public reason" (35). By way of "self-exemption" from the others, however, they unavoidably turn into "supreme judges in the court of reason" (41). Rasch's problematizing of Kant's adamant insistence on reason culminates in a harsh and even hostile polemic against Habermas. This polemic merely serves as a means to construct a passage to Lyotard, whose ideas about the signs of history are then interpreted as a way out of the Kantian humanist project: in the end, a new paradigm is set for the intellectual to orient herself towards the ideal of the reflective judgment (48).

But why should we think of the role of intellectuals as limited to the practices of reflective judgment? Rasch owes us an answer to this question. If we take Kant's conception of reflective judgment seriously, we must recognize that a community of intellectuals engaging exclusively in the practices of reflective judgment would not only go beyond any scientific community that relies on discursive rules but also beyond the ethical (and perhaps also political and legal) community in which the capacity to oblige is central as it is governed by laws, by rights and duties. In light of this, we might be tempted to reconsider the intellectual's role. Should it not at least also consist in the task of mediating between these distinct orders of human interactions in such a way that the distinctions between them are not blurred but made productive?

Chris Thornhill ("Idealism and the idea of a constitution") guides the reader through the development of this idea from Kant (and Rousseau) to Fichte, Schelling, Hegel and Marx. He draws attention to the sociological turn that occurs within the Idealist movement -- away from the pure construction of the principles of political legitimacy towards the attempt to illuminate their embeddedness "in the normative structure of society itself" (74). By turning to post-Kantian Idealism, Thornhill offers a fundamental reflection on the complex, initially antagonistic relationship between sociology and philosophy. He seeks to show that from the very beginning constitutional theory has been the medium in which revolutionary changes in society and politics have become self-reflective: the Enlightenment conceptualizations of the "state as an abstracted legal person" and "a public actor under law" (52) not only coexisted with the actual European state building process but were internal to it.

While each of the figures discussed -- Fichte, Schelling and Marx -- aimed at "a reconstruction of the normative residues inherent in socio-factual process" (73), for Thornhill it was Hegel whose reflection on the relation of theory and practice in its "double reflexivity" (76) attained a degree of complexity unmatched in later sociology. Thornhill closes by noting with respect to Niklas Luhmann that "It is only recently, in the sociology of concepts, that the Hegelian insistence that theory is the intelligence of its own object has been reappropriated" (76). In light of this, we can only join Thornhill in speculating about "what political theory might have become" (76) if it had made this Hegelian insight fully productive.

In his insightful "German Idealism and Marx", Douglas Moggach turns to the idea of spontaneity as "a central and distinctive concept of German philosophy since Leibniz" (86) that remained largely undertheorised with regard to Marx (102). By giving an account of how various ideas from Kant, Fichte and Hegel have been reconfigured in Marx's concept of labour, Moggach argues that labour is indeed to be regarded as "Marx's version of spontaneity" (91). Yet, by rejecting juridical rights, Marx undermines the complexity of the dialectic of freedom and heteronomy and falls back to the Wolffian metaphysics of perfectionism (101). It is this Marx of paternalistic perfectionism that has later been propagated "in the theory of the party, and in the Soviet state's privileging of need satisfaction over freedom" (102). Moggach, however, discusses Marx's approach to human activity in the context of post-Kantian perfectionism -- from Schiller and Fichte onwards -- that holds "that the development of certain capabilities is of intrinsic, and not merely instrumental, value" (100). It is surprising (and a pity) that the reference to the capabilities approach pioneered by Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum is missing in this account. It would have been particularly fruitful to confront the Marx presented in this essay as a thinker of free human agency with the accounts of the development ethics.

Steffen Wagner's "Ethos, nature and education in Johann Erich von Berger and Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg" makes the reader wonder why it is important to discuss Berger's philosophical assumptions in such great detail. Would it not have been much more productive to illuminate the role of Trendelenburg himself, whom Klaus Christian Köhnke characterized as the decisive figure in the transition from speculative idealism to Neo-Kantianism? Strangely enough, Köhnke's landmark study on The Rise of Neo-Kantianism is not even mentioned in Wagner's historiographical piece. The depiction of Berger's ideas on nature and ethical life is instructive as a background that informs Trendelenburg's "teleological-organic world-view" (109). Yet, as the volume focuses on political and social thought, much more could have been said for instance on the distinctly political significance of the societies Wagner mentions and especially on the Association of the Free Men in Jena since 1794-95 that Fichte referred to as the archetype of an ideal state. The significance of the new forms of living together, like the "circle of philosophical farmers" (123) around von Berger and Hülsen in Holstein in the early 1800s, could have been discussed in the larger context of the genuine cult of friendship and the distinct culture of sociability that emerged around this time. Is there a link here to Schiller's vision of the "aesthetic state" that according to his famous dictum "exists in every finely tuned soul"?

The next two essays focus on the two major competing philosophical movements of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries: Neo-Kantianism and Lebensphilosophie.

Stephan Nachtsheim ("The concept and philosophy of culture in Neo-Kantianism") seeks to demonstrate that in a climate of positivism and the predominance of natural sciences, the Neo-Kantian movement with its two main schools -- the Marburg school of Cohen, Natorp and Cassirer as well as the Southwest German school of Windelband, Rickert, Lask, Cohn and Bauch -- has become a bulwark to secure the independence of philosophy. Nachtsheim traces the development of Neo-Kantianism from the initial focus on epistemology to "a total philosophy of culture" (141) that was preoccupied with the theory of validity of norms. The appreciation of Neo-Kantian philosophy as a cultural movement itself leads Nachtsheim to a brief discussion of its impact on virtually all areas of human sciences and on politics (153). However, perhaps more could have been said on German nationalism and the strivings for a German political unity as one of the "cultural forces" behind the "rise of neo-Kantianism".2

David Midgley ("After materialism -- reflections of Idealism in Lebensphilosophie: Dilthey, Bergson and Simmel") gives a superb overview of the key philosophical concepts of the major figures of Lebensphilosophie by linking them back to the central concerns of German Idealism. To Midgley, these three figures "exemplify the historical trends in philosophical thought" (163) such as the turn towards a hermeneutics of concrete human experience and a rediscovery of "life as a creative process" (161) against the alienating conditions of living in modern, industrialized societies at the turn of the century. Midgley's analyses are very instructive, but there is regrettably no discussion of the relation of Lebensphilosophie to social and political philosophy. Likewise, no reference is made for instance to Plessner's anthropology and his critical engagement with Dilthey.

The next two essays mainly focus on Frankfurt School critical theory and its precursors. In "'Rationalisation', 'reification', 'instrumental reason'", Fred Rush deals with these "three concepts central to modern European social theory" (188) and traces the "peculiar, ex negativo sort" (188) of Idealist legacy that animates them. Rush focuses on the Kantian ethics of moral autonomy and self-rule grounded in reason as it informed not only Weber's concept of rationalisation and Horkheimer's and Adorno's critique of instrumental reason but also the concept of "reification" that he explicates with regard to Lukács and Marx.

After a discussion of Weber's interpretation of "Kant's ethics as a rigid, secularised version of Protestantism" (201) and an attempt to make sense of Horkheimer's and Adorno's notorious claim that "Kant is Sade," Rush closes his illuminating essay with a reference to Schopenhauer's ethics of suffering: imagining the other's suffering -- "what it is like to suffer in that way" (203) -- requires a radical break with abstract rationality. Thus, while remaining true to the Idealist project, Schopenhauer represents a way out from the "calculative" character of Kant's duty-based morality of internalized coercion. For Rush, the late Horkheimer's admiration for Schopenhauer is an indication that Horkheimer still upholds the idea that non-instrumental reason, however, is "possible in Idealism," while "Adorno seems to have no clear answer" to it (203).

In light of this, Brian O'Connor's essay can be read as demonstrating that Adorno indeed does have an answer to it, even if this answer is "precariously conjectural" (229). "Freedom within nature: Adorno on the idea of reason's autonomy" is a careful reconstruction of how in his Negative Dialectics Adorno fundamentally rethinks the radical opposition to nature lying at the core of Kant's concept of reason. O'Connor focuses on how Adorno, drawing on Freud, points to a fatal mistake to conceive reason as "nature's otherness" and thus to 'forget' "nature in reason itself" (227). Instead, by taking our "biological drive for self-preservation" (224) seriously, reason is to become a self-reflective activity of un-forgetting.

Another interesting reflection concerns "Adorno's notion of autonomy as a resistance to the norms that socialise us" (fn. 31, 231). To Adorno, late capitalism threatens to leave us with no "outside" -- in the sense that its logic turns reason into the mere "mechanism of negotiating intra-institutional life" (213). By highlighting that the dimension of not-being-determined by social normativity is inherent to autonomy, Adorno so radicalizes the Kantian notion of negative freedom that it merges with his criticism of late capitalism. O'Connor leaves this unmentioned, but this insight has been made productive in Albrecht Wellmer's criticisms of Habermas's discourse theory in Endgames and also in the more recent studies by Christoph Menke on the relation between aesthetics, anthropology and politics such as Force. In his studies Menke operates with the category of force in order to demonstrate that human freedom never fully converges with social freedom.

The next two essays turn to the dark chapter of the uses and abuses of Hegel's philosophy of law in Germany after the First World War and in fascist Italy under Mussolini.

Andreas Grossmann ("German neo-Hegelianism and a plea for another Hegel") provides an informative account of the key elements of neo-Hegelian appropriation of Hegel's philosophy and its abuse for ideological justifications for the Third Reich after 1933. Representatives of the neo-Hegelian movement, among them Julius Binder, Karl Larenz and Gerhard Dulckeit, celebrated what they claimed to be the "real Hegel" (236) for his anti-liberalism and anti-individualism as well as his doctrine of "national Geist" (Volksgeist). Grossmann particularly focuses on Larenz, who remained one of the most prominent private law professors in postwar Germany in the 1950s and 60s. Central to Larenz's neo-Hegelianism was the rejection of the abstract equality before the law that led to "a disempowerment of subjective right in the face of community obligations" (246) as well as the doctrine of the "Concrete Idea of Order" (247) in a state that was conceptualized as an organic whole (243).

The essay ends with reference to postwar liberal thinkers like Joachim Ritter, Ernst-Wolfgang Böckenförde and Rüdiger Bubner. Their efforts were effective in reclaiming Hegel as a thinker whose liberalism goes beyond the notion of abstract freedom: it seeks to explicate its institutional presuppositions and turns to the forms in which freedom actualizes itself. It is perhaps somewhat regrettable that the essay does not give sufficient room to more recent re-actualizations of Hegel: Axel Honneth's Freedom's Right for instance was referred to only en passant, while Robert Pippin's work, especially his Hegel's Practical Philosophy was not mentioned at all.

Focusing on the doctrine of corporatism, Irene Stolzi ("Idealism and the fascist corporative state") addresses the relationship of the individual and the state in the appropriations of Hegel's legal philosophy in juridical science in Italy since the mid-1910s. At the rise of fascism in Italy, jurists like Ugo Spirito, Arnaldo Volpicelli and later Giovanni Gentile all propagated "the victory of the universal over the particular" in form of "a state capable of including the whole spectrum of social and political forces" (264). By addressing "the key political problem of the twentieth century: how a mass society should be governed" (272), the theorists of a corporatist state not only rejected the separation of civil society and the state which is central to Hegel's Philosophy of Right, but they also sought to abandon the "distinction between law and politics" altogether while asserting "that politics should become the actual driving force of law" (266), as did Spirito and Volpicelli.

Stolzi draws particular attention to the centrality of corporatist concern with private property. She explains this with the double-opposition of the corporatist doctrine to both liberalism and socialism. She also pursues the development of corporatist ideas in Giuseppe Maggiore and Cesarini Sforza. In the end, Stolzi expresses a warning about the tendency in Italian legal thought to misinterpret corporatist thinking as completely negligible -- an attitude that not only prevented it "from understanding the totalitarian nature of some theorisations of corporatist fascism," but also, as she provocatively claims, "has led to the exclusion of Italian juridical thought from the planning of the new democratic course" (273).

The next three essays show that Idealist theories of recognition developed by Fichte and Hegel -- notwithstanding the highly ideological nature of their own gender theories -- had a major impact on later feminist philosophers' positions on gender, especially on Simone de Beauvoir's Second Sex but also on her poststructuralist critics like Judith Butler and Luce Irigaray.

Marion Heinz's "Love and recognition in Fichte and the alternative position of de Beauvoir" displays the "scandalous" ambivalence of Idealist theories of intersubjectivity: they seem progressive as they ground the revolutionary principle of equality not on a contractualist model rooted in the natural law tradition but on "the theorem of recognition" that brings to the fore "the structures of identity and difference internal to subjectivity" (278). However, the very concept of recognition is clearly undermined -- indeed, betrayed -- as far as gender relations are concerned. Heinz shows how a very similar perfidious double-logic of elevation and demotion of women operates both in Rousseau's Émile and in Fichte's account of love and marriage from Foundations of Natural Right.

Heinz argues that female sex itself poses a contradiction to Fichte's philosophy that "cannot be resolved by the conceptual means available to his system" (292). Only by turning to the master/slave-dialectic from Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit has it become possible for de Beauvoir to make explicit how women who are caught in the immanence of "the reproductive cycle of sheer life" were "prevented from even entering into the struggle for recognition" and were thus "denied the status of a freely self-determining subject" (281).

In fact, all three essays point to the ambiguity within de Beauvoir's work: Her essentialist claim about the female's reproductive nature sits ill with her other core insight that "women are not born women but rather become such" (306). Sabine Doyé and Disley trace this ambivalence back to Hegel.

Doyé's "Hegel's concept of recognition and its reception in the humanist feminism of Simone de Beauvoir" is particularly thought-provoking when she suggests that Hegel's concept of gender relations merely exposes his failure to reconstruct the socio-economic and political conditions required for the Spiritual to become what it is in its actuality: "the locus and medium of mutual recognition" (308). Instead, the separation between family and civil society in Hegel's Philosophy of Right once again evokes the picture of a female 'counter-world' standing ironically against the polity -- a picture which is expounded in the sections of Phenomenology that interpret Sophocles' Antigone. Whereas a man realizes himself in civil society and is able to fully achieve his self-conscious subjectivity in the "concrete universal of the state," for Hegel the ethical existence of a woman is bound to the sphere of the family, a sphere that belongs to the state "only negatively, as sublated" (308).

In "Giving an account of oneself amongst others: Hegel, Judith Butler and social ontology", Disley follows Hegel's concept of recognition in contemporary social philosophy, both in its Continental and analytic traditions. She particularly analyses the problem of the failure of recognition (314) and turns to Butler's appropriations of Hegel's dialectic of recognition in Subjects of Desire as well as Giving an Account of Oneself  in order to show that recognition is neither a "cognitive process" (as it is not "coextensive" with judgment) nor a "disembodied one" (325).

In the last section of her essay, Disley parallels the discussion of Hegel and Butler with the social ontology debate that was inspired by John Searle's The Construction of Social Reality. The turn to simulation theory and the mirror neurons to explain our capacity to understand the other's behavior is instructive as an attempt to point to the possibility of cognitivist uses of Hegel's theory of recognition. In light of Butler's ecstatic account of subjectivity, however, where the self can never fully return to oneself but "continues to find itself outside itself" (322), this parallelization is surprising and appears to be an afterthought.

The volume closes with Jörn Rüsen's essay on the impact of "Idealism in the German tradition of meta-history". For Idealist philosophers of history -- Rüsen mentions Gatterer, Iselin, Schlözer, Kant, Herder, Schiller and Hegel -- the very concept of history was genuinely linked with the notion of Entwicklung (development). This allowed them to distinguish mere changes from historically significant transformations "in which the finite form may enter into a union with the idea" (335), as Wilhelm von Humboldt famously stated in his essay "On the historian's task". Today, as this "confidence in the ability of ideas to shape the human world" (340) has been irrevocably shaken, the challenge for both philosophy and the practice of history consists in "an intellectually honest recognition of the historical experience of inhumanity and suffering, which 'Idealist' categories once served to suppress." Rüsen concludes by noting that the task yet to be achieved is "to discover what kind of idealism this new kind of historical realism will require" (341).

Given the scope of the collection and the wide range of issues discussed, it is not an easy task to evaluate the volume as a whole. It should be emphasized and acknowledged that with three essays out of fifteen devoted to philosophy of gender, the volume has attached great significance to this important and yet still largely neglected topic. It must be noted, though, that all three essays focus particularly on de Beauvoir's appropriation of Idealist accounts of recognition and intersubjectivity, with the exception of Disley's reflection on Butler. Although the essays complement each other very well, the impression prevails that many contemporary voices were omitted. Jessica Benjamin's psychoanalytic account of recognizing the other comes to mind, Kimberley Hutchings's work on Hegel, including the recent volume she coedited with Tuija Pulkkinen on Hegel's Philosophy and Feminist Thought: Beyond Antigone? also remained unmentioned, along with Alison Stone's work that explores the complex ways in which Hegel's philosophy of nature provides metaphysical grounds for his gender theory, to mention but a few contemporary feminist philosophers engaging with Idealism.3

What is also striking is that the volume gives a lot of attention to hermeneutic thinking but never addresses the question of in what ways hermeneutics is still relevant for social and political philosophy today, perhaps also in its relation to deconstruction -- another powerful and diverging philosophy of interpretation and a form of critical practice that has been sadly completely neglected in this collection.

Another point worth mentioning concerns the ambivalent genealogy of the concept of German Idealism. In the first volume of the "Impact of Idealism" project, Nicholas Boyle addresses the problems of definition only very briefly. However, there is no mention either in the first volume or in the second volume that the term German Idealism was invented and popularized by two neo-Kantians, Friedrich Albert Lange and Wilhelm Windelband, in a specific cultural and political climate in which the interest for "German idealism" was fueled by an eschatological mood among the intellectuals to reassure themselves of those traditions of philosophy around 1800 that were deemed ethically valuable, in particular the love for the fatherland.4

This cultural-historical background is certainly not decisive for contemporary scholarship on German Idealism or classical German philosophy, as some prefer to call it in order to avoid the historiographical formula "from Kant to Hegel" and to account for other powerful inspirational sources for the German philosophy around 1800 like Jacobi and Spinoza. But to leave this background completely unmentioned in a volume that focuses on historical, social and political thought -- and gives a great deal of attention to Neo-Kantianism and the cultural climate in the second half of the nineteenth century -- can indeed be criticized as a shortcoming.

These remarks, however, by no means diminish the volume's great merit. All the essays are distinguished by a high level of scholarship and build on longstanding questions while bringing fresh perspectives to their studies. The collection as a whole undoubtedly offers a comprehensive picture of the complexity of the task and the interdependence of central questions under discussion. It will surely contribute to the ongoing debates on the impact of German Idealism and will serve as a rich resource for students, scholars and the interested public alike.

1 Jean-François Lyotard, Enthusiasm: The Kantian Critique of History, trans. George Van Den Abbeele (Stanford University Press, 2009), 65.

2 Cf. Frederick C. Beiser, The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796-1880 (Oxford University Press, 2014), 11.

3 I am grateful to Federica Gregoratto for pointing me to some of these studies.

4 Walter Jaeschke, "Zur Genealogie des Deutschen Idealismus. Konstitutionsgeschichtliche Bemerkungen in methodologischer Absicht", in Andreas Arndt und Walter Jaeschke (eds.), Materialismus und Spiritualismus: Philosophie und Wissenschaftennach 1848 (Meiner, 2000), 219-234, at 225 f. (my trans.).