The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, Volume III: Aesthetics and Literature

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Christoph Jamme and Ian Cooper (eds.), The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, Volume III: Aesthetics and Literature, Cambridge, 2013, 334pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107039841.

Reviewed by Robert Wicks, The University of Auckland


To appreciate the tremendous impact of German Idealism, we need to reflect solely upon the history of dialectical logic. Consider how Marxism -- one of its immediate offspring -- inspired the Russian Revolution of 1917 and the subsequent history of the Soviet Union and China. It is also difficult to forget in later years the Post-World War II nuclear confrontation between the U.S.S.R. and the U.S.A. in October 1962. Among German Idealist philosophers, even the lesser-known Karl Christian Friedrich Krause, the panentheist and inspirational figure behind Krausism, can claim an influence that extends far beyond his own lifetime to the Cuban Revolution of the 1950's.[1]

Understanding the importance of German Idealism, Cambridge University Press has published a four-volume series, The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, edited by Nicholas Boyle and Liz Disley. The first volume focusses upon philosophy and the natural sciences, the second, upon historical, social and political thought, the third -- our present subject, edited by Christoph Jamme (Leuphana University Lüneburg) and Ian Cooper (University of Kent) -- highlights aesthetics and literature in a collection of thirteen essays, and the fourth, religion.

The third volume explores the impact of German Idealism in relation to the rise of academic aesthetics (Jamme), Hegel's philosophy of action (Klaus Vieweg), Hegel's theory of tragedy (Allen Speight), Hegel's influence on contemporary philosophy of art (Stephen Houlgate), romanticism and literature (Stefan Matuschek), nineteenth-century German literature (Cooper), British and American literature (Richard Eldridge), Schopenhauer and Beckett (Ulrich Pothast), music (Roger Scruton; Andrew Bowie), architecture (Felix Saure; Petra Lohmann) and museums in Massachusetts (Ivan Gaskell). Approximately half of the scholars (Jamme, Vieweg, Matuschek, Pothast, Saure, Lohmann) are based in Germany, write in German, and offer a fresh perspective on these topics for English-speaking readers. Cooper's introduction summarizes each essay briefly in a clear, descriptive overview.

The volume's opening essay, "The Legacy of Idealism and the Rise of Academic Aesthetics," by Jamme, sets the scene by reflecting upon some difficulties in defining German Idealism. Jamme observes that if one identifies Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel as the principal thinkers, the sharp differences between them quickly undercut attempts to circumscribe their commonalities. Aiming to include significantly Hölderlin, Novalis, Friedrich Schlegel and Schleiermacher among the influential authors of the time, Jamme's preferred approach -- one inspired by Walter Jaeschke -- is to speak more comprehensively of "classical German philosophy."

After considering the definitional question, Jamme attends specifically to Hegel, and surveys his widespread influence in the fields of theology, jurisprudence, sociology, literary scholarship, art theory, and art history. Concluding with Schelling, Jamme leaves us with an endorsing reminder that in its appeal to freedom, Schelling's philosophical conception of the university speaks directly and critically to the contemporary and questionable tendency to understand universities as training centers and servants of the state, economy and commercial society.

The second and third essays -- by Vieweg and Speight respectively -- attend to Hegel's theory of punishment and Hegel's theory of tragedy. Vieweg's is "Hegel's Philosophical Theory of Action: The Concept of Action in Hegel's Practical Philosophy and Aesthetics"; Speight's, "Tragedy and the Human Image: German Idealism's Legacy for Theory and Practice." These are essays in Hegel scholarship proper, requiring their readers to be familiar with the Hegelian terminology with which both are saturated.

Vieweg develops within the context of Hegel's Philosophy of Right, the idea that during the heroic age of antiquity "The hero [recall Oedipus] stands up unambiguously and unreservedly for whatever consequences spring from his own deed," whereas modern thought -- and Vieweg regards Hegel as having influenced present-day thinking heavily in this regard -- "typically distinguishes, where action and our judgment upon action is concerned, between premeditation, purpose and intention, and the consequences and circumstances of the deed" (p. 40). Speight discusses Hegel's account of tragedy as a species of drama, and his essay unfolds mainly as an exercise in genre theory and comparative taxonomy, viz., intending to understand how tragedy is to be classified as an art form. After observing that "The nineteenth- and twentieth-century after-currents of the Idealists' consideration of tragedy run in many directions, but most of them seemingly away from the notion of tragedy as conceived by Hegel and Schelling" (p. 65), Speight hypothesizes that "the most important legacy of Hegel and Schelling for a consideration of tragic drama might be that drama, as its etymology suggests, is most deeply about action and in this sense brings before us 'the complete human being'" (p. 66).

Matuschek's "Romanticism as Literary Idealism, or: a 200-Year-Old Way of Talking About Literature," addresses the impact of German Idealism upon recent conceptions of literature. Using Schiller as the take-off point, Matuschek defines two forms of "literary idealism": [1] where the writer is summoned to represent ideals (e.g., the perfect X or perfect Y), and [2] where the literary form itself is regarded as the ideal mode of expression. He argues that the first conception of literary idealism, called "normative idealism," is a thing of the past, but that the second, called "categorial idealism," which is presented in detail as a legacy of romanticism, remains alive and well today. An example cited is the contemporary view that poetry absorbs all other forms of speech, as in some poststructuralist theories of textuality.

If we are concerned with preserving historical accuracy, Matuschek's extended attention to Schiller is worth some reflection. As is known, Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) set the scene for subsequent aesthetic theory, and has earned Kant the name, "the father of modern aesthetics." Many of the seminal ideas which Matuschek associates with Schiller, such as that great art is not created by following rigid rules and that art is an expression of freedom, are Schiller's appropriations from Kant. Since the volume's project is to consider the influence upon aesthetics and literature of "Classical German Philosophy," post-1800, Kant's role in the history of aesthetics falls just outside of the volume's scope, remaining consequently in the background subthematically and somewhat unsuitably.

Cooper follows with "Idealism in Nineteenth-Century German Literature." Grounded upon a noticeably Kojèvian reading of Hegel's master-servant relationship which emphasizes the development of the servant's consciousness through the fear of death, Cooper presents Hegel's influence in the work of Goethe [Faust], Büchner [Lenz], Mörike [poems], Hebbel [plays], Wagner [writings], Nietzsche [writings], and Mann [novels].

In each of these writers, Cooper identifies aspects and transformations of themes in Hegel's master-servant discussion, typically in reference to the confrontation with death. For example, he believes that Hegel's discussion informs Nietzsche's construal of master versus slave morality. In the course of the various expositions, Cooper at one point presents an understanding of German Idealism which is more romanticist than one would normally ascribe, stating that "what might be taken as the central claim of absolute Idealist thought" is "that the negation of time and contingency and desire cannot ultimately be understood as negation at all, and that the only adequate word is love" (p. 96). Emphasizing love accords well with the Hegel of 1797, when he was closely associated with Hölderlin, but it is less sustainable as a characterization of Hegel after the 1807 publication of the Phenomenology -- the work which introduces his later system of absolute idealism wherein knowledge via feelings is explicitly subordinated to that arrived at through purely conceptual activity.

Next Richard Eldridge ("Idealism in Nineteenth-Century British and American Literature") considers English-speaking authors, discussing Wordsworth, Coleridge (1772-1834), Austen, George Eliot, Dickens, Carlyle, Emerson, Thoreau, Whitman, Melville, and Woolf.

Eldridge maintains that the more concrete European and American mindset of the 19th century challenged the Cartesian epistemological, self-enclosed outlook (Eldridge describes this as "representationalist") in favor of a view -- one, we can add, expressed in Hegel's critique of Kant in the Introduction to the Phenomenology -- which acknowledges that we are always already immersed in a context which includes and extends beyond our individuality, and accordingly must construct our theories from within that more true-to-life setting. Upon the differentiation between skeptical, naturalistic, and idealistic outlooks as described by Norman Kemp-Smith, in conjunction with the distinction between writers who were directly influenced by German Idealist thought as opposed to those who merely shared the same basic concerns, Eldridge surveys the above authors knowledgeably and effectively to reveal some of their idealistic features. There was no mention of Emerson's notion of the Over-Soul in relation to the tradition of German Idealism, though, which given its familiarity, left this reader puzzled.

In view of the volume's broad understanding of Post-Kantian German Idealism, the next essay brings Schopenhauer onstage. Pothast surveys Schopenhauer's outlook insofar as it influenced Beckett, and suggests generally regarding Schopenhauer's influence upon writers and artists that "Schopenhauer openly claimed an epistemic, more precisely a metaphysical, primacy of art over philosophy and over science . . . that turned many artists into Schopenhauer partisans" (p.150).

Pothast emphasizes Schopenhauer's view of the spatio-temporal world as a great penitentiary, filled with frustration and pain, observing in Beckett's work how this is embodied in hopeless and suffering characters who can find no escape from their dreary condition. Unlike Schopenhauer, who obtains salvation in the deep tranquility of transcendent mystical experience, Beckett remains fully down-to-earth, cognizant only of the determinate spatio-temporal reality within which we live fruitlessly.

Echoing Sartre's No Exit, Pothast writes that "the true subject of Endgame, therefore, is by no means ending or dying, but having to continue living in a hell-like ever-lasting present and not being able to end or die at all" (p. 160). Worth mentioning here is a contrast between Beckett and Nietzsche, since both acknowledge the suffering-filled condition of the spatio-temporal world in the absence of any further salvation in a world beyond. Unlike Beckett, who sustains a Schopenhauerian evaluation of the world as he dramatically conveys the image of hopelessness, Nietzsche affirms life and enthusiastically embraces this violence-filled world. Unlike Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, though, each of whom offers their own form of salvation -- Nietzsche, a this-worldly, supremely thrilling one, and Schopenhauer, an other-worldly, utterly peaceful one -- Beckett's 20th century presentation of hopelessness is absolute.

Turning next to the influence of German Idealism in music the volume contains two idea-rich essays. The first is "German Idealism and the Philosophy of Music" by Scruton; the second, "The Music of German Idealism" by Bowie. Scruton is concerned with a central question in the philosophy of music, namely, that of understanding the difference between music and meaningless noise. He suggests that the difference involves our listening to sounds as if the sounds were speaking to us, which he refers to as an "acousmatic" way of listening. This way of listening underscores music's objectification of "subjectivity," which Scruton acknowledges as one of German Idealism's major contributions to the philosophy of music, especially through Schelling, Hegel, and Schopenhauer.

music presents subjective awareness in objective form. In responding to expressive music we are acquiring a 'first-person' perspective on a state of mind that is not our own -- indeed, that exists unowned and objectified, in the imaginary realm of musical movement. (p. 180)

Scruton offers a nicely textured historical presentation of subjectivity as a theme in German Idealism, ranging from Kant's historically antecedent notion of the transcendental unity of apperception to Schopenhauer's will as thing-in-itself. When he mentions how music provides a first-person perspective on someone else's state of mind, it is easy to interpret him as suggesting that music is unique in this respect. It would have clarified the exposition to note that when one reads an author's words, one is brought into objective contact with the conceptual aspect of the author's subjectivity, and when one watches a video shot from a camera upon the person's head, or a photograph taken by a person, one is given access to the visual aspect of a person's subjectivity. Along the lines Scruton suggests, one can say that music more precisely delivers a first-person access to the emotional aspect of someone else's subjectivity.

Bowie sets out in support of the Post-Kantian German Idealist effort to reinscribe a conception of human freedom and meaning into our concrete, day-to-day activity -- a conception focused on life and organic unity -- as a constructive reaction to the 18th century mechanistic and objectifying conception of nature. In reference to the latter, he links contemporary philosophical methodologies which in the wake of natural science's success, seek "to establish which concepts can be applied correctly to whatever the object of investigation is" (p. 182) and which, in effect, conceive of their subjects inappropriately as "objects." Inspired by 20th century thinkers such as Adorno and Heidegger who wrote extensively about the dehumanizing and alienating consequences of applying scientific methods to human beings, Bowie reminds us that "objectification is not the only way to make sense of things" (p. 200).

Music enters into the picture as a salvation and relief from objectifying modes of thought, given its ability -- especially when conceived of as pure sound independently from language -- to lend meaning to aspects of our lives which defy linguistic formulation. Bowie argues that an important legacy of German Idealism stems from its attention to music as a way to provide meaning within dimensions of life that escape scientific and literalistic linguistic articulation, achieving this through rhythm and the "combination of the intellectual and the somatic" (p. 201).

The essay's standpoint will be familiar to anyone who has read Heidegger, but Bowie develops it with impressive density and detail, making a good case for appreciating that the problem of objectification can be understood well if we begin around the year 1800, when German Idealist thinkers started to become uneasy with Kant's mechanistic conception of nature and with Enlightenment conceptions of reason in general. To convey Bowie's view on German Idealism and music, perhaps one can say the following: it is not that whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent; it is rather that whereof one cannot speak, one can play music (which, contra Ramsey, would include whistling).

Saure's "'Refiner of All Human Relations': Karl Friedrich Schinkel as an Idealist Theorist" and Lohmann's "Influences of German Idealism on Nineteenth-Century Architectural Theory: Schelling and Leo von Klenze," attend to German Idealism and architecture. Saure maintains that the great Prussian architect, Karl Friedrich Schinkel, "was not merely close to the Idealists, but his general attitude makes him one of them" (p. 205). To establish this, he portrays Schinkel's thought as a conceptual amalgam which, from Fichte, has a strong nationalistic tenor, from Hegel, a theory of historical epochs which characterizes the ancient Greeks as creatively superior to the Romans, and from Schiller most saliently, a criticism of the modern era which, noting the emergence of more rigid and alienating divisions of labor, prescribes the need for moral improvement via aesthetic education.

Matching Schinkel's stature in Prussia was von Klenze in Bavaria, who adopted Schelling's conception of organic unity as a way to create Christian architecture. In an essay of impeccable scholarship, Lohmann presents von Klenze's defense of architecture as a fine art as an extension of Schelling's characterization of sculpture as a fully organic art. The animation of geometrical forms is paramount, and as von Klenze absorbed Schelling's high respect for Greek art, he is shown to walk the dangerous ground of regarding Christian art as a continuity from Greek art, opening himself thereby to the charge of atheism. As Lohmann describes it, von Klenze was convinced that "Greek architecture was the only possible form of Christian architecture" (p. 231). After describing the influential relationship between Schelling and von Klenze, Lohmann indicates how Schelling's conception of organic unity appears later in the work of Frank Lloyd Wright.

At first sight, Gaskell's "'Making a World': The Impact of Idealism on Museum Formation in Mid-Nineteenth-Century Massachusetts" concerns a minor influence, since notable museums were forming around the same time in Washington D.C. (e.g. The Smithsonian Institution, founded 1846 [rather than 1836, as we read in the essay]), in Pennsylvania (e.g., The Franklin Institute, founded 1824), as well as in other parts of the world (e.g., the Prado in 1819; the Alte Pinakothek in 1836; the National Gallery in 1824; the Egyptian Museum in 1838).

The essay, however, successfully characterizes a fundamental debate in the theory of classification, namely, between those who develop their classifications in view of a presupposed unitary design to the subject matter at hand versus those who work more empirically from the ground up, with less of a philosophical set of directive and formative presuppositions behind them. To phrase the situation in terminology from Kant's aesthetics, this debate concerns two ways to make reflective cognitive judgments, where reflective judgment is understood as the activity of finding an appropriate concept for a given individual or set of individuals.

Gaskell presents these two approaches as embodied respectively in Thoreau and Louis Agassiz, the once highly celebrated founder of Museum of Comparative Zoology at Harvard University. Whereas Thoreau was more empirically-disposed and Darwinian, supplying coincidentally for Agassiz's museum hundreds of North American Indian artifacts and biological specimens from the area surrounding his cabin at Walden Pond, Agassiz was influenced by German Idealism via Schelling, with subsequently a closer affinity to the idea of intelligent design. Gaskell's essay is predominantly a historical piece in museum scholarship seasoned with light philosophical references to Goodman, Cavell, Brandom, and most relevantly, William James who, while a student, accompanied Agassiz on an expedition to Brazil. Within its chosen sphere, it is authoritatively-informed and illuminating in its portrayal of the usually overlooked interactions between Agassiz and Thoreau.

The collection concludes with Houlgate's "Hegel, Danto and the 'End of Art'," wherein Houlgate applies his formidable knowledge of Hegel's philosophy to map the exact depth and extent of Hegel's impact on Arthur Danto's understanding of the difference between art and non-art. After describing three different senses in which Hegel refers to the end of art, Houlgate reliably outlines Danto's position for comparison and contrast. Danto, as many know, after having considered the art historical and philosophical significance of Warhol's Brillo Boxes, maintained essentially that distinguishing art from non-art is not a perceptual, but a conceptual and philosophical matter.

Houlgate brings Hegel to life by challenging Danto's claim that "there is no way works of art need to look" (p. 281), stating that from Hegel's own point of view, genuine works of art are indeed perceptually distinguishable from non-art. Defending Hegel's position, viz., that as a matter of logic, "essence must appear" (p. 286), Houlgate contends that Hegel's logic is presuppositionless, unprejudiced, and convincing. Whether Houlgate is correct -- and his advocacy of a presuppositionless beginning may seem quixotic -- or whether Warhol's Brillo Boxes or Duchamp's Fountain, when appreciated through Danto's philosophy of art, succeed in reducing Hegel's perception-fastened position to absurdity, we can leave as a matter of future debate.

In sum, The Impact of Idealism, Volume III, contains some exciting and worthwhile essays, all of which are well-written. No one is likely to be familiar with the full range of topics addressed, so for anyone interested in the legacy of German Idealism in aesthetics and literature, it will be easy to find some rewarding essays therein.

[1] Richard Gott, "Karl Krause and the Ideological Origins of the Cuban Revolution," University of London, Institute of Latin American Studies, Occasional Papers No. 28, 2002.