The Implicit Mind: Cognitive Architecture, the Self, and Ethics

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Michael Brownstein, The Implicit Mind: Cognitive Architecture, the Self, and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 262pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190633721.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, Macquarie University/University of Oxford


The past decade has seen growing philosophical interest in implicit bias: that is (roughly), in biases against members of historically disadvantaged groups that people often appear to have but which they may disavow and struggle to control. Through a series of journal articles, and through the two-volume collection of papers he edited with Jennifer Saul (Brownstein and Saul 2016a; 2016b), Michael Brownstein has established himself as one of the foremost voices on the topic. This book goes significantly beyond those journal articles, presenting the first comprehensive overview of the nature of implicit bias, and its importance for our self-understanding and for morality.

We often think of implicit bias as a threat to moral agency: something that prevents us from acting in line with our better selves. Brownstein's starting point is the observation that an ethics of spontaneity has to encompass very much more than the apparent threat our biases represent to our acting well or rationally. We are, for example, spontaneously generous, sometimes in ways we would not be were we to deliberate. We may admire people who act, as Bernard Williams put it, without "one thought too many." Many of our impressive achievements are caused by mechanisms that work without apparent deliberation: think of athletic performance or musical improvisation. These achievements seem to manifest intelligence in action, not mere reflexes or the unfolding of overlearned sequences. Brownstein suggests that these behaviors, the impressive and the good and the morally bad alike, are all caused by a single kind of state: implicit attitudes. His aim is to understand the nature of these attitudes, and to enable us to better govern our behavior, in part by governing our attitudes.

On Brownstein's view, implicit attitudes are sui generis unified states characterized by what he calls FTBA components. They are states that dispose us to respond to features of objects in ways that generate tension in us, motivating behaviour aimed at alleviation of the tension. Features are properties of objects that "make certain possibilities for action attractive." Unlike the more familiar "affordances", features have an "imperatival quality" for those who perceive them. It is in virtue of this quality that a feature elicits tension in the agent, which motivates behavior aimed at alleviation of the tension. Borrowing an example from Hubert Dreyfus and Sean Kelly (2007), both in illustration of the account and to demonstrate how pervasive and familiar these kinds of states are in human behavior, Brownstein describes our response to a very large painting. If we enter the room in which the painting is displayed through a door that is close to it, its sheer size serves as a feature, which generates a feeling of tension in us (perhaps without our explicitly noticing it). We respond to the imperatival quality by stepping back, adopting a more appropriate viewing position. Doing so alleviates our felt tension.

Implicit attitudes are affect-laden, though the affect may be recessive and unnoticed by the agent. (The strength of the link between affect and implicit attitudes is unclear: Brownstein says that affect plays a role in "paradigmatic cases"; elsewhere he suggests something even weaker, saying that implicit attitudes "can" satisfy the FTBA conditions.) In part because the attitudes are affect-laden, they are attributable to us: that is, they are ours in a sense deep enough to warrant aretaic appraisal. For Brownstein, something is thus attributable to us when it constitutes one of our 'cares;' a care, in turn, is constituted by a disposition to experience certain, appropriately connected, emotions. He notes that agents may feel conflicting emotions as well, but argues that this conflict is no problem for his account. Agents may possess conflicting cares. They may care deeply about gender equality, say, while also have emotional responses (perhaps without realizing it) that constitute a caring with a content something along the lines of <women-incompetent> (because implicit attitudes are not beliefs, on Brownstein's view, their contents cannot easily be expressed propositionally). Aretaic assessability, in turn, entails (or perhaps just is) a certain kind of moral responsibility for the attitudes.

Resistance to the claim that implicit attitudes are deeply attributable to us may stem, in part, from thinking that they are mere reflexes or stereotypies. Brownstein argues convincingly that it is a mistake to think of them as mindless. Not only do they underlie our exquisitely attuned responses across a broad range of contexts, from athletic performance to witty conversation, they are finely tuned by constant feedback in a way that refines them. Nevertheless, implicit attitudes also generate implicit biases. Brownstein quotes a line from The Lego Movie to capture these two faces of implicit attitudes and the problems this duality presents us with: "Trust your instincts . . . unless your instincts are terrible!"

For many of us, our instincts are wonderful and terrible: wonderful in some domains, terrible in others (and, perhaps, middling in many). What should we do when we discover our instincts are terrible? Building on Daniel Dennett's distinctions between the intentional, physical and design stances, Brownstein argues we should take the "habit stance" to our implicit attitudes. We cannot see them merely as reflexes, for they embody intelligence. But we cannot directly control our behavior intentionally through them. Rather, the habit stance involves seeing them as partially to be nudged, partially to be cultivated and partially to be designed. In the final substantive chapter, Brownstein outlines a number of promising strategies we can adopt when we take the habit stance to ourselves, ranging from implementation intentions ("when a woman is talking, I will listen!") through to approach and avoidance behaviors.

While there is an overarching unity to The Implicit Mind, it is a rich book and there is much to build on and much to disagree with in its pages. Unfortunately, Brownstein makes it difficult to discern when his views conflict with those of others, by using terminology in an idiosyncratic way and by occasionally misrepresenting the views of others. For example, while he follows others in distinguishing attributability, answerability and accountability, he understands these different kinds of responsibility as mapping onto a distinction between being responsible and holding responsible. That seems to be a mistake: agents are or are not responsible, in any of those senses, independent of whether they are held responsible by anyone, and they may be held responsible in any of those senses. Whether it is mistaken or not, it certainly differs from how the terminology is most standardly used (admittedly, the debate isn't univocal in its use of terms, and Brownstein may have a different sense than mine of what contributions are central, and therefore terminology-settling). He also appears to conflate accountability, as it is commonly used in the debate, with having institutional or social responsibilities. These idiosyncrasies in terminology make it difficult to assess the extent to which his claim that we are responsible for our implicit attitudes conflicts with the claims of those who deny we are. Typically, the latter have a basic desert sense of responsibility in mind, which is a kind of accountability independent of having responsibilities.

Assessing the conflict between his views and others is made more difficult by his misinterpretation of others. I must confess an interest here, since Brownstein takes issue with my own views on responsibility for implicit attitudes. I suspect that the disagreement on central claims is a lot smaller than he suggests: I attribute much more intelligence to nonconscious processes than he seems to think, and the role I attribute to consciousness is correlatively smaller and more indirect than he thinks. It is frustrating to be criticised for neglecting certain kinds of cases and the implications they have for my views after having devoted considerable attention to just these cases. No doubt others will see any mistakes Brownstein makes in Levy-interpretation as a lot less serious than Levy himself does.

Research on implicit attitudes -- especially when they are understood as broadly as Brownstein does here -- is in flux, and relatively new, so it's not possible to be very confident concerning several central claims Brownstein makes. Are implicit attitudes "paradigmatically" affect-laden? It is worth highlighting how similar the FTBA architecture is to the influential predictive processing view of cognition, which aims to explain all mental processes in terms of prediction and error minimization, with 'surprisal' playing the role of tension and error minimization that of alleviation (Jakob Howhy 2013; Andy Clark 2016). Surprisal may or may not be affect-laden (when errors are easily minimized, no affect is likely to be experienced). The supposed imperatival quality of features is plausibly constituted affectively, but it is not apparent that implicit information processing always, or paradigmatically, has this quality. Brownstein cites utilization behavior, a neurological condition in which agents fail to inhibit their responses to the features of objects, as evidence that features have an imperatival quality. But case reports of utilization behavior seem to involve agents who respond without apparent affect. He also notes that implicit biases are modulated by emotions (consider how shooter bias is reduced by thinking "safe!"). But the context specificity of the manifestation of such biases suggests that the state is not constituted by all the FTBA components: rather, it manifests some of the components in some contexts and not in others. In many cases, implicit biases seem to change the salience of information without affect playing any apparent role. Perhaps FTBA states explain all spontaneous behaviors, but implicit attitudes certainly play a role in deliberation, and in these cases the FTBA picture seems less plausible.

If implicit attitudes are often not affect-laden, they do not constitute cares, given Brownstein's account of the nature of cares (on several occasions, he invokes the view that all cognition is affect-laden, but this strategy has the risks of multiplying cares excessively, and rendering the care condition redundant, insofar as it will do no work in settling the extension of the concept). On Brownstein's view, being affect-laden is not sufficient for constituting a care: the relevant emotions must be continuous and referentially connected. He claims that implicit attitudes satisfy this condition, because their relata are conceptually connected. This account seems to yield a picture of cares, and therefore attributability, that departs significantly from the picture others have urged and which seems more natural, inasmuch as the resulting attitude will be much narrower than we tend to think. The evidence suggests that the relata are co-activated in highly specific circumstances. Shooter bias, for instance, shows moderate test-retest reliability, but appears to yield only a narrow attitude, on the FTBA construal: not only an attitude with a highly specific content but one that occurs only in a highly specific context. Similarly, implicit attitudes are subject to renewal effects, in which a bias extinguished in one context returns in full force in another that differs only trivially from it. Again, this suggests only a narrow attitude, and thus that agents will not have broad traits attributable to them like "being racist".

As Brownstein himself argues in the useful appendix on the psychometric properties of implicit attitudes, the low correlation of different measures may be due to their tapping into different components. This fragmentation may reasonably be seen as problematic for his claim that they constitute cares. These data suggest that implicit attitudes are often (paradigmatically) discontinuous and disconnected. It is hard to see how aretaic evaluation can be grounded on such attitudes. Having a disposition to behave in certain, narrow, ways, in certain, quite specific, contexts seems to fall short of having a character trait, for reasons familiar from the debate over virtue ethics and situationism. It is extremely hard to see how the attitudes satisfy the neo-Lockean condition on constituting cares Brownstein claims to accept: supporting the cohesion of the agent's identity over time.

The FTBA account of implicit attitudes takes certain bets on how future research will pan out. These bets are not unreasonable, but I don't think the current state of research compels us to think they represent the most probable predictions. Even if the FTBA account is vindicated, many of Brownstein's further claims are contestable. Substantive philosophical work on the nature of cares and on assessing the extent to which our management of our agency involves the adoption of a habit stance, in particular, may lead us to very different views. Of course, there is a great deal more empirical work to do, too; one of the virtues of this book is that it generates clear predictions and provides concrete guidance concerning how we best probe implicit attitudes.

Make no mistake, The Implicit Mind is not the last word on the topic, but it is the state of the art today. For those deeply engaged in these debates, and those who should be but are not (all those ethicists whose work takes a stand on the nature of the mind, but who are content to substitute intuitions for data), it is essential reading. It deepens our understanding of what it means to be human.


I am grateful to Michael Brownstein for comments on a draft of this review.


Brownstein, M. and Saul, J. (eds). 2016a. Implicit Bias and Philosophy: Volume 1, Metaphysics and Epistemology. Oxford, Oxford University Press

Brownstein, M. and Saul, J. (eds). 2016b. Implicit Bias and Philosophy: Volume 2, Moral Responsibility, Structural Injustice, and Ethics: Oxford, Oxford University Press

Clark A. 2016. Surfing Uncertainty. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dreyfus, H. and Kelly, S. 2007. Heterophenomenology: Heavy-handed sleight-of-hand. Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences. 6: 45-55.

Hohwy, J. 2013: The Predictive Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.