The Importance of Being Rational

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Errol Lord, The Importance of Being Rational, Oxford University Press, 2018, 261pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198815099.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, Birkbeck College London


This book grows out of its author's 2013 PhD thesis and a score of articles and book chapters published on this and related topics over the last decade. After negotiating some occasionally distracting narrative adjustments, inter-sectional repetition and potholes of absent copyediting, the book offers an informed, original, rich, sophisticated and exceptionally well-illustrated case for the claim that what we are rationally required to do and what we substantially ought to do is really the same thing. To follow Errol Lord on his route to this conclusion is a frequently rewarding experience and one that is well worth undertaking.

The main thesis Lord defends is one he labels 'Reasons Responsiveness'. In its canonical formulation, reasons responsiveness is the view that rationality consists in correctly responding to the objective normative reasons an agent possesses. This carefully distilled formulation embodies an original solution to a number of well-known controversies in the recent literature, and is defended by creatively combining several strands of independent research which have each enjoyed an explosive growth over the last two decades, as exemplified by the path-breaking work of John Broome, Jonathan Dancy, Niko Kolodny, Mark Schroeder, Ralph Wedgwood, Timothy Williamson, and others. Perhaps the most similar contribution to Lord's in the recent literature is Benjamin Kiesewetter's The Normativity of Rationality (Oxford 2017), a work which could helpfully be read in tandem with Lord's.

We don't have to go back much further than three or four decades to find a philosophical environment in which the terms of the current debate might seem unfamiliar, contrived or even redundant. Yet as Lord shows in his close and sensitive readings of the recent literature on the subject, at least some of the underlying questions have been relatively constant over time in one formulation or other, including the scope of formal (or 'pure') rationality to generate substantial normative (such as moral) requirements, and the relationship between reasons and motivation. What is new is mainly a function of how the old nomenclature have been constantly contested and revised, at least partly in response to how different branches of the subject (such as ethics, epistemology and the philosophy of mind) have been brought into creative dialogue with each other. It is therefore safe to say that the case for and against Reasons Responsiveness amounts to more than a mere terminological dispute, even if (as Lord notes in one or two cases) it could easily look otherwise to an external observer with no horse in the race.

Two long-standing issues in the literature are particularly relevant to understanding the significance of Lord's book and how his view is able to deliver its distinctive explanatory pay-offs.

The first issue concerns the relationship between reasons and motivation. On Lord's view, in order to make sense of this relationship we need to make sense of three different sets of reasons. First, there is the set of 'normative' (or 'objective') reasons. These are facts about the world that speak in favor of some things rather than others (such as the fact that the kettle has just boiled speaks in favor of me using it in order to pour water to make some tea). What makes for the existence of normative reasons is a topic on which Lord is deliberately silent in this book, although his argument is constructed so as to be consistent with a wide range of views about the 'grounds', or 'truth makers', of normative reason claims. As ought to become clear shortly, this relative neutrality turns out to be to Lord's advantage. Either way, if your real worry is where the truth is really located on this issue, you are better off looking elsewhere.

Second, there are 'motivating' reasons. These are considerations conceived of by an agent as normative reasons to do some things rather than others even if they are not, and which can therefore be cited in the explanation of action in 'bad cases' (such as the false consideration that my lungs are filling with water could be cited by me as speaking in favor of calling the emergency services.) What makes for the existence of motivating reasons is that agents like us are able to regard certain options in a favorable light even if they are not actually so favorable, and even if we are not ourselves able to articulate what speaks in favor of those options in explicitly normative terms. Thus, Lord agrees that toddlers and pets are able to regard certain considerations as 'shining a light' on some potential actions rather than others from their individual perspective, even though they may not have the conceptual sophistication to conceive of their motivating reasons in terms of the concept of a normative reason as such.

Third, and most importantly for Lord's purposes, there are 'possessed' reasons. These are normative (or 'objective') reasons that an agent is in the position to manifest their knowledge of in acting in accordance with them in some situation. (Thus, if the boiling kettle is within hearing distance, I will normally possess the fact that it has just boiled as a reason to pour water to make some tea. On the other hand, if the kettle is in the building next door, I may not possess that reason, however useful it might have been to use the kettle to pour water to make some tea even in this case.) According to Lord, it is our 'possessed' reasons that fix what we substantially 'ought' to do. In spelling out what he means by normative reasons being possessed, and what rational agents need to be able to make of such reasons when they are, Lord patiently takes the reader through a series of pitfalls in the analysis of what it means for someone to act on a reason given the possibility of deviant causal chains and the like (e.g. when my recognition of the fact that the kettle has just boiled causes me to pour water to make some tea, but only by accident).

One notable consequence of Lord's account is that we end up with a 'disjunctivist' view of acting for (either normative or motivating) reasons, the rationale and implications of which have interesting features in common with analogous discussions of disjunctivist views in the philosophy of perception. Also in common with arguments found in the recent literature on perception is an 'externalist' account of how agents who are deceived about the reasons they possess can still be as rational as their non-deceived counterparts, in virtue of being in a position to know that it appears to them that they have those reasons. Lord's exposition of the problem presented by such cases and the default externalist solution to them are located in the penultimate chapter.

The second long-standing issue of particular relevance to understanding Lord's view is the issue alluded to in the book's title, namely the relationship between reasons and rationality. On Lord's view, we make best sense of that relationship by understanding rationality in terms of Reasons Responsiveness. It follows that rationality is a matter of responding appropriately to the normative (or 'objective') reasons that there are and that we are in the position to manifest our knowledge of in acting in accordance with them. (Thus, if my lungs are actually filling with water and I have heard expert warnings to that effect, I am being irrational in not seeking medical help, however coherent I may otherwise be in my deluded sense of immortality.) To put what is essentially the same point in slightly different terms: to be irrational is like failing to respond to factual evidence that is both to hand and that you have the ability to grasp the significance of if you attend to it. To be rational is to appropriately respond to said evidence, so described.

Historically speaking, there is nothing wildly exceptional about this conclusion. If we take a broad enough view, we should expect to be able to find plenty of examples where questions about 'rationality' are treated as interchangeable with questions about 'reason' (and, more recently, 'normative reasons') in dealing with this and similar issues. What may seem to make Lord's conclusion unusual is that in the last decade or so, the term 'rationality' has tended to receive a comparatively formal interpretation in terms of consistency or coherence. And as Lord (following Broome, Kolodny, Raz and others) points out, it is by no means obvious why consistency and coherence merely as such should be regarded as normatively authoritative. (Orthodox Kantians will obviously disagree. But then it is not as if they never had their day in court.) This is one place where an independent observer might worry that we are dealing with a terminological dispute. Yet not only is Lord sensitive to this concern, he also has things say in response to it (see e.g. pp. 219ff).

I agree with Lord that the question whether someone is actually in a position to manifest knowledge about how to make use of a genuine reason in a given situation picks out a significant category of evaluation and criticism. Indeed, I suspect it is a category of great ethical interest. In this respect, I think Lord has done the subject a valuable service in articulating and defending the Reasons Responsiveness view. But is the category of reasons as 'possessed', in Lord's sense, the uniquely basic, or central, category of its kind? I find that hard to believe.

It seems to me that depending on what is at issue, there is a plurality of questions that could form the focus of evaluation and criticism of how well I do by way of exercising my rational faculties. To mention just three (among others): we might evaluate and criticize someone for how they fail to make use of facts that speak in favor of doing one thing rather than another, but that are just beyond the grasp of that someone, given her present state of intelligence and understanding (e.g. during a process of development or education). Alternatively, we might evaluate and criticize someone for the way she fails to make use of facts we think that people just ought to make use of whatever their present state of intelligence or understanding (e.g. because they are clearly being wrong-headed). Or we might evaluate and criticize someone for how they make use of a set of considerations only some of which obtain in a certain situation, but some of which do not (e.g. because we are interested in the extent to which she is able to make sense of the world as she -- imperfectly -- sees it). Each question is in some way or other intimately connected to questions of someone's rational 'standing', 'merit', or (in Lord's terminology) 'creditworthiness'. I therefore remain cautiously skeptical about why, within the limits of intelligibility, only one among the options here should be thought to pick out what we are doing when we criticize someone as being 'irrational'.

I also remain to be convinced that the category of reasons as 'possessed' has to be considered the uniquely basic, or central, question of what someone 'ought to do'. In spite of Lord's admirably frank insistence that 'I am always after the answer to one question -- what ought I to do?' (p. 227), it seems to me that there is more than one form that this question could sensibly take, and that in some cases it is not even the most important question. (Perhaps the most important question in a certain context is: 'What kind of life should I want to have lived?', from which an answer to the question 'What ought I to do?' is best understood as derivative, secondary, or parasitic.) I think it would be worth considering why, within the limits of intelligibility, only one among the options here should be thought to pick out what we are doing when we criticize someone for not doing what they ought, or for otherwise acting against the reasons we think they have. In philosophy as elsewhere, it is often a sociologically specific, interest-relative, or even autobiographical matter what 'the question' is, or how 'the question of what the question is' should itself be decided.