The Importance of Being Understood: Folk Psychology as Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Morton, Adam, The Importance of Being Understood: Folk Psychology as Ethics, Routledge, 2003, 225pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415272432.

Reviewed by Constantine Sandis , University of Reading


There is no denying that in everyday life human beings attribute beliefs, desires, thoughts, and emotions to one another. In this sense we are, all of us, folk psychologists. More importantly, though we might often be mistaken in our particular attributions, we are doubtlessly generally right to attribute such things both to others and to ourselves. This book is an attempt to map out the relation between this truism (eliminativism is largely ignored save from a one-line attack on p32) and the further fact that we often successfully predict how people are going to act by explaining why they will do so. Morton's central claim is that 'sometimes and in some ways we understand because we can cooperate rather than the other way around' (p2). That is to say it is partly because we can engage in cooperative activity that we can predict, explain, and understand action.

The book is divided into two parts. The first and largest part of the book presents us with his arguments for this main claim with Morton guiding us through questions relating to co-operation motivation, belief ascription, causal explanation, and simulation. The second half does not present us with any further arguments for Morton's view; instead it offers us four 'explorations' into moral psychology which we might wish to pursue - if we find ourselves sympathetic to the central claim of Part I - and tells us why these possibilities (concerned with attribution bias, introspection and expression, evaluation, and moral progress) are worthy of serious consideration. So in effect what we have is a monograph supplemented by the author's proposals for further research. I begin with former.

According to the traditional folk-psychological picture, we first infer what people are thinking and feeling from their behaviour and only then, having understood one another, do we (indeed can we) begin to engage in shared activities. Morton argues against this view by emphasising the 'beneficial circularities between our capacities to attribute states of mind and our capacities to engage in shared activities' (p148). What he means by this is that 'our understanding of mind and action is, in part, shaped by its need to mediate shared activity, just as the shared activities we undertake are shaped by the need to rely on our capacities to gather and conceptualize information about one another' (p149). The argument comes mainly by example and overall it is persuasive.

As one might expect, many of the examples are modified versions of classic game-theory puzzles while others are cooperation problems of a much broader sort. Morton labels this latter category 'microethics', where this stands for 'the collection of ways of thinking we have in everyday life for finding our way through frequently occurring situations in which the stakes are low but there are potential conflicts of interest between individuals' (p2). He guides us through possible ways in which we might reason in such situations, acknowledging that, although solutions to cooperation problems are frequently derived from psychological attributions, we just as frequently derive our information about someone's thoughts and intentions by reasoning about the solution to the problem in question.

The idea then is that we reach a judgement about what we ought to do first, and only then form an expectation of what the other person will intend/desire to do etc. To give one of his examples: someone is helping you move a table through a narrow doorway. Will he turn the table to the left or to the right? There might well be some advantage to one of these ways but the truly important thing is that both of you turn it the same way when the decisive moment comes. He is acting as if he will turn to the right, so you move your hands accordingly. In this way you make it understood that this is the agreed course. You then predict that he will stick to it, partly because it is what he should do (pp14-15).

Of course one might object that the only way you could have made the prediction was by inferring from his behaviour something about the other agent's psychology, namely that he intended to move right (where his intention is best understood as a belief-desire pair). Morton doesn't deny this. The point, rather, is that had you then moved as if you were going for a left turn, he would probably not have moved right. So his action is shaped by yours as much as yours is by his, and what you both have on common is a conception of what one should do in cases such as this. What we have here, therefore, is a case of beneficial circularity as described above. Moreover - and this is the important point - in microethical cases when each of you tries to ascertain what the other will do, you typically don't try to figure out what their interests (viz. beliefs and desires) are before you figure out what the correct joint course of action would be. You might then infer from this that he will do whatever will promote this, but again prediction here will not solely depend on knowing what the other person's interests were. Rather, by letting him know what you intended to do, you gained 'a predictive hold' over his behaviour. In this sense, we can influence the actions of others by letting others know what our own interests are. This isn't only true of joint actions but also of any situation where what the one person does depends on the actions of those around him and what they do (in turn) depends on how they believe he is going to react (Morton's favourite examples include driving, playing tennis and robbing banks). It is therefore important for us (if we are to get what we want) that we make ourselves understood.

Morton summarises this thought in his claim that folk psychology exists because ethics exists: it is because we find ourselves in ethical situations that we make ourselves intelligible (hence the book's subtitle). Of course 'ethics' is to be understood here in a rather loose sense as something like 'the enterprise of helping one another to the best lives' (pvii). An ethical situation then is one 'in which it makes a difference to each agent what each other agent does' (p148). Likewise Morton defines 'folk-psychology' loosely as 'whatever beliefs, skills or other cognitive processes human beings use in everyday life to predict and understand actions' (p206 cf. pvii), explicating that by this he means nothing more than our 'everyday understanding of one another' (p2).

Given these definitions the claim that folk psychology exists because ethics exists seems to be both true and interesting. Unfortunately Morton's own position loses much of its appeal once we realise that despite his attempts to use the term 'folk-psychology' in a non-loaded sense, his actual understanding of it betrays deep theoretical commitment. For according to Morton to say that a person believes something is to attribute them with a mental state (pvii) and to give a person's reason for acting is to cite the action's main cause (pp10-11). Not only do these commitments make it impossible for those who don't share them to reach the same conclusions as Morton (or at any rate to interpret his conclusions in the same way) but at times they also prevent some of his own arguments from getting through. Even more unfortunately they restrict some of his most exciting ideas to parameters in which they cannot do the work they are most naturally suited to. In this respect Morton's book is like a zoo of beautiful wild animals that are caged and improperly fed. This environment is particularly unsuitable for the kinds of explorations he invites us to join in the second half of the book.

So, for example, in the second 'exploration' he confesses to being 'very uncertain what Wittgenstein is trying to persuade us about the states we express: can they coincide with causes of our actions' (p161), when it is clear that Wittgenstein did not think that we express states or that actions are caused at all (let alone by any states that we express!). As a consequence of this Morton fails to develop the kind of expressivism that would best suit his own views. A similar difficulty arises when in the same exploration he tries to give an account of introspection.

An altogether different example of theory constraining originality can be found in 'Exploration IV: Moral Progress', where Morton attempts to convince us that justification and explanation can never be completely distinct since good reasons for action could explain why someone actually performed an action (p190). This seems the right way to go given the role of microethical judgements in situations such as the one the table-movers find themselves in in the example above. Here Morton's folk-psychological commitments prevent him from turning this into an interesting claim about action explanation since at best these reasons will somehow have to find themselves affecting the agent's action by being one of its many causal determinants (p11), a job which good reasons are ontologically ill-suited for as it is, even before we introduce the folk-psychological conception of motivation which Morton relies upon in the first half of the book. This is unfortunate because, were it not for his (theoretical) folk-psychologism, not only would these explorations be more rewarding but they may indeed have been solid enough to incorporate into the monograph itself.

This is not to say that Part I is not infected with theory either. In Chapter 4 (on explanatory contrast) we witness a powerful idea: 'that we get better explanations if we focus on ends rather than motives' (p81) being deprived of its bite because it turns out that what makes one explanation 'deeper' than another is its 'causal depth' (pp85-6). But what was most interesting about Morton's central claim is the intuitively appealing idea that when we engage in shared activities our predicting what the other person will do is not the result of an empirical investigation into the potential causes of his behaviour. In fact the examples were pushing towards the idea that the aim alluded to in teleological reasons is not a cause (in the form of an intention) but an (intended) effect of our doing something.

It would be a mistake however to let a few folk-psychological tenets keep one from what is an otherwise tantalising read. Morton's book presents us with a much-needed break from traditional accounts of understanding, and yet it comes without the price of our having to abandon our vernacular psychology. This is no small achievement, especially given the outstanding clarity of the argument throughout. It is therefore a great shame that the author expresses himself in terms whose theoretical implications prevent him from giving his own views the breathing space they need.